Space, Time, and Theology in the Leibniz-Newton Controversy

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Edward J. Khamara, Space, Time, and Theology in the Leibniz-Newton Controversy, Ontos, 2006, 157pp., $89.95 (hbk), ISBN 3938793260.

Reviewed by Edward Slowik, Winona State University


As the title suggests, Khamara's book examines a number of important themes that emerge in the famous dispute between Leibniz and Newton on the nature of space, time, motion, and theology. The main focus of Khamara's work, not surprisingly, is the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence, which represents probably the most renowned confrontation of the "absolute" and "relational" conceptions of space and time (Samuel Clarke, a friend and supporter of Newton, put forward the absolutist case in the correspondence with Leibniz, and was most likely assisted by Newton). Put roughly, a "relationist" holds that space and time are simply the spatiotemporal relationships among existing material bodies, whereas an "absolutist" denies this claim (e.g., for an absolutist, space and time transcend the actual spatiotemporal relations manifest among bodies and entities, such that space and time can exist even in their absence; more on this below). The first seven chapters of Khamara's book concentrate on the various theses and arguments that constitute both Newtonian absolutism and Leibnizian relationism (although he prefers the term "relativist" to "relationist"), with a considerable effort devoted to determining the core theses required for each view of space and time. Khamara summarizes his work as an attempt to "reassess Leibniz's attack on Newtonian absolutism in so far as he relied on the principle of the identity of the indiscernibles [PII]" (p. 8), where the latter is Leibniz's famous principle that (put roughly, once again) no two individuals can share all of their properties. On the whole, Khamara concludes that several formulations of the PII are successful against Newtonian absolutism, whereas other are not (chapter 6); and, while Khamara does not necessarily take sides in the dispute, he does seem to favor Leibnizian relationism over Newtonian absolutism (see, e.g., p. 9). Khamara's treatment of these issues, moreover, falls within the tradition of analytic metaphysics, with little or no attention devoted to the more mathematically technical approaches favored by contemporary philosophers of physics (especially spacetime physics). The final three chapters of the book treat theological problems associated with God's eternity and omniscience, for example, whether God exists in or outside of time. Some of the material in this book is based on past publications that span several decades, such as several from Philosophical Quarterly (1970s and early 1990s), Studia Leibnitiana, and Sophia.

There are many informative and interesting discussions in Khamara's book, such as his analysis of the different versions of PII (chapters 5 and 6), or the exploration of how the different hypotheses that comprise both Leibniz's relationism and Newton's absolutism are interconnected. For instance, Khamara delineates 10 individual theses in Newton's theory, and 8 in Leibniz's, and then examines how each of these claims is either dependent or independent of the core concepts of the relevant theory (chapters 2 and 3). Khamara's close analytical scrutiny of the various strands in Newton's and Leibniz's respective theories of space and time is thus quite commendable, and has the potential to spark a newfound interest in the hierarchical ranking of the many concepts and issues that constitute this venerable debate.

Regrettably, there are also a considerable number of problems with Khamara's overall approach and analysis of the issues, and the cumulative effect of these problems is such as to ultimately militate against a positive endorsement of his book. In what follows, I will indicate several of these difficulties.

First of all, in the fields or disciplines that comprise this work (e.g., philosophy of space and time, Newton and Leibniz studies, etc.), Khamara's book is not sufficiently up-to-date as regards advances in scholarship and research. Khamara's evaluation of absolute and relational theories of space and motion, for instance, is largely confined to an analysis of several articles that date to the early 1970s (by Armstrong, Nerlich, Hooker, Lacey, and others). Needless to say, there has been a considerable amount of scholarly work devoted to this topic over the past 30 years, such as the important contributions provided by Friedman, Earman, Maudlin, and, more recently, Huggett, and Belot, to name only a few. It is not an exaggeration to conclude that this field has changed considerably from the early 1970s, with the result being a greatly increased awareness and appreciation of the inherent complexity and diversity of these issues. Khamara does mention John Earman's important 1989 work, World Enough and Space-Time, although he confines his discussion to a trivial aspect of Earman's critique (i.e., Earman's claim that Leibniz's reply to Clarke was a result of "opportunism and one-upmanship", see p. 95-99 in Khamara's text). There are a host of more important issues to discuss in Earman's text: for instance, Earman distinguishes several varieties of relationism, and the fruits of this research could have helped Khamara in his analysis of Leibniz's theory in chapters 2 and 3 (nor does he address Earman's specific criticisms of Leibniz's theory). An oversight of recent research also lessens the appeal of the other chapters that comprise this work, most notably, the important investigations of Newton's concept of absolute space by both Howard Stein and Robert DiSalle (see, e.g., their essays in The Cambridge Companion to Newton, 2002), or Daniel Garber's influential analysis of Leibniz's physics (see, e.g., Garber's essay in The Cambridge Companion to Leibniz, 1995). To demonstrate how this recent research would have assisted Khamara, one only needs to reflect on the difference between Newton's substance-less definition of "absolute space", from the Principia, and Newton's rejection of the Scholastic and Cartesian notions of "substance", as revealed in his earlier unpublished tract, De gravitatione. As Stein and DiSalle have (separately) argued, there are excellent grounds for keeping apart the concepts of absolute space and substantival space (i.e., space as a type of substance or entity) in Newton's natural philosophy. Khamara never investigates these issues, and so one is left with the impression that any appeal to Newtonian absolutism is an endorsement of substantivalism. If one also takes into account the varieties of relationism that are now commonly discussed in the literature (see, e.g., Earman's text noted above), some of which come close to a form of absolutism without a corresponding commitment to substantivalism, then it becomes all the more apparent that Khamara's rendition of the absolute/relational dichotomy simply does not do full justice to the complexity of this historical and conceptual debate.

The most troubling deficiencies in Khamara's book, however, are due to an inadequate treatment of several important issues involving Leibniz's theory of space and motion. One of these problems concerns Leibniz's sanction of two apparently incompatible hypotheses, namely, that all motion is the relative motion of bodies, and that bodies in relative motion can (nonetheless) possess individual states of motion (since they may possess individual forces -- Khamara cites the passage in the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence, Leibniz's fifth letter, article 53, although a better discussion is in the Discourse on Metaphysics, article 18). Khamara dismisses this famous puzzle in the following succinct fashion: "As was explained earlier, what Leibniz means by true motion is a species of relative motion; so it is sheer distortion to equate Leibniz's true motion with Newtonian absolute motion, which requires the separate existence of absolute space and absolute time" (p. 47). Earlier, he defines a "true motion", for a Leibnizian relationist, as a motion of a body, X, relative to another body, Y, but such that "the cause of that change of situation lies in X rather than in Y" (p. 37), and, in a later discussion of Armstrong's criticisms, it becomes clear that Khamara is relying on Leibniz's use of material-based reference frames to defend the relationist account of motion. Since space is the order of co-existing bodies for Leibniz, Khamara follows Leibniz in stipulating that there must exist a number of reference bodies that do not change their positions relative to one another over time, and by this means the reference bodies can provide a fixed frame for measuring the relative motions of other bodies: the concept "same place at different times", for example, "can only make sense relatively to a frame of reference held to be fixed for a period of time that bestrides the earlier and later times" (p. 51). Yet, since the reference bodies are, in fact, bodies, it is always possible that they may possess a "true motion" as well, due to a cause (i.e., force) possessed equally by each of the reference bodies -- and, provided Khamara's brief perusal of these issues, it is unclear how he would handle this quandary. Is Khamara's idea of a "true motion" dependent on an external reference frame, such that bodies would not move, nor possess a force, if there were no such frames? In classical (Newtonian) mechanics, position and velocity are relative to inertial frames, but acceleration (=force) is not, for it is an invariant of these frames. Conversely, there are many scenarios wherein reference bodies can maintain their relative distances and configurations, such as the parts of a rotating planet, while nevertheless experiencing the (centrifugal) force associated with the rotation: Is there no force, on Khamara's estimation, since there is no change of place of the planet's parts relative to one another (and assuming no other fixed reference frames)? In short, to develop a physics along the lines that Khamara (apparently) suggests is a very complicated affair, for it requires making a number of complex physical assumptions that the committed Newtonian may find quite objectionable: e.g., the contemporary Machian-inspired Barbour-Bertotti constructions stipulate a zero angular momentum for the entire material universe. Consequently, there are currently no strict relational theories that can treat all of the scenarios handled by Newtonian mechanics (i.e., scenarios without the types of special conditions just discussed). Khamara's omission of these very relevant facts thus does not inspire confidence in his overall treatment of Leibnizian relationism.

As one would expect, Leibniz's use of the PII to defeat Newtonian absolutism also figures prominently in Khamara's book, but there are many problems with the analysis in these chapters (4-7) as well, although only a few will be discussed. First, Khamara thinks that Leibniz's "static shift" argument, as it is often labeled, does indeed work against Newton's absolute space, whereas the "kinematic shift" fails to undermine absolutism: both arguments appeal to the PII; the former claims that a world where all the material existents occupy different places in absolute space (a static shift) would be indiscernible from a non-shifted world, and the latter holds that a world where all of the bodies possess a different state of uniform rectilinear motion (a kinematic shift) would likewise be indiscernible from a non-kinematically shifted world (assuming that all of the relations among bodies remain fixed). Khamara appeals to "pure" and "impure" relational properties in his analysis (chapter 4). Impure relational properties would seem to necessarily involve particular individual beings, whereas pure relational properties do not: "being a pupil of Plato" is thus impure relational (because one being, Plato, serves as a relatum), whereas "being a pupil" is pure (since many different people can serve as the relevant relatum). Furthermore, pure relational properties count as intrinsic (or internal) properties for Khamara, but the impure do not (pp. 61-64, 75-77). Now, in the static shift case, both the shifted world and the non-shifted world bear the same pure relation "occupying the same spatial position in absolute space", so both are indiscernible. In the kinematic shift case, the shifted world has the pure relational property "occupying different regions of absolute space", whereas the non-kinematically shifted world has the pure relational property, "occupying the same spatial position in absolute space", and thus there is a difference in intrinsic properties among these worlds, and this difference in intrinsic properties renders the two scenarios discernible. So, the static shift argument succeeds against Newton's absolutism, but the kinematic shift does not. This is a fairly remarkable conclusion, to say the least, and Khamara should have opted instead to read these results as a reductio of his assumptions regarding pure and impure relational properties, as well as his characterization of intrinsic. First of all, the claim that a pure relational property ("being a husband", etc.) is an intrinsic/internal property is itself quite controversial, and Khamara does little to justify this assertion. Second, the kinematic shift argument need not be interpreted as a difference between a stationary and a moving world. In fact, Leibniz's argument (in the fourth letter to Clarke, article 13) is suitably ambiguous so as to allow a mere difference in the degree of uniform motion of the material universe (i.e., the kinematically shifted world now possesses a different degree of uniform speed in a given direction, or there is a simple difference in direction, and most commentators include these scenarios within Leibniz's overall case). On this reading, both the kinematically shifted and non-shifted worlds thus move (although at different inertial speeds), and thus both possess the identical pure relational property "occupying different regions of absolute space" -- hence, the kinematic shift does violate the PII, contra Khamara. Third, Khamara admits that one can conceive pure relations as impure relations whose domain is a class of entities, rather than just one (pp. 59-60). But, since impure relations are not intrinsic for Khamara, one can now turn all of the pure relational properties in his examples into impure ones, and thereby undermine his case against Leibniz's kinematic shift argument.

It should be noted, moreover, that the objections raised thus far only comprise a sample of difficulties encountered in reading Khamara's text. Here are a few others: Khamara appears to conflate "necessary being" and "necessary truth" (p. 32); he fails to adequately treat the idea that space is an attribute or affection of Newton's God, as is so often claimed in the De gravitatione (and this is quite important for understanding Newton's absolutism); and he, quite curiously and without adequate argumentation, contests Newton's definition that God is an immovable being (here, he claims, "Why should the divine substance be immovable?"; but clearly everyone is free to define their conception of God as they would wish, so this criticism is simply not germane, pp. 111-112). Finally, a few comments are in order for the last three chapters of the book. On the whole, these chapters have little relation to the first seven, and should have been left out (and replaced by a deeper investigation of the first seven). Chapter 8 concerns Boethius' conception of eternity and omniscience, but little effort is devoted to explaining its relevance to the Leibniz-Newton controversy. The topic of omniscience returns in chapters 9 and 10, and mention of its relevance to the Leibniz-Clarke debate is discussed, but Khamara's proposal that Newton's God should exist outside of time is not adequately developed, but offered more as a suggestion. Chapter 10, on the other hand, is more concerned with the paradoxes associated with God's omnipotence as they arise in Leibniz's correspondence without Arnauld, not Clarke. Khamara's suggested solution, that God can only accomplish those feats that are logically possible (p. 141), is put forward as if it constituted an original insight into this problem, although it has been one of the standard replies to the paradoxes of omnipotence since at least the time of Aquinas.

To recap, while the issues and general presentation of the concepts and arguments in Khamara's book are acceptable, the repeated failure to engage in a rigorous investigation of these concepts and arguments, as the above examples attest, cannot but fail to leave the reader somewhat frustrated (or, at the least, this reviewer was quite frustrated). A final note: this book is included in a series entitled, Process Thought, but the relationship between Newton and Leibniz, on the one hand, and Whitehead's philosophy, on the other, rather eluded the reviewer.