Space, Time, Matter, and Form: Essays on Aristotle's Physics

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David Bostock, Space, Time, Matter, and Form: Essays on Aristotle's Physics, Oxford University Press, 2006, 194pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199286867.

Reviewed by Inna Kupreeva, University of Edinburgh


This volume offers a study of several key topics in Aristotle's Physics. The first five of its ten essays are described by the author as the extant remains of his abandoned larger monograph on Aristotle's doctrine of substance. The rest are devoted to selected problems in Aristotle's Physics. The reprints (six articles) are supplied with updating notes. The volume is addressed to all students of ancient philosophy. Bostock often uses mathematical concepts to elucidate his analysis, but these explanations are clearly written and require no special background.

1. In 'Aristotle on the Principles of Change in Physics I' (1982), Bostock addresses the question of whether the account of form and privation as opposites constitutes a sound generalisation of the pre-Socratic doctrines operating with concrete oppositions (hot and cold, dry and moist etc). His answer is 'no', the reason being that 'Pre-Socratic'-style opposites are the extremes of an ordered continuum, whereas Aristotle's form and privation are merely logical negations of each other, and as such do not presuppose any continuum. Bostock believes that Aristotle's opposites cannot therefore describe the changes 'from a middle state', such as a change of grey into white, temporary loss of skill, etc. The objection does not seem obvious to me: the task of form and privation in Physics 1 is to bring out the general logical structure of any change, without qualification, whereas the question of individuation of change involves a host of special issues with which Aristotle deals elsewhere (e.g. in Physics 5, GC 1 etc).

2. In 'Aristotle on the Transmutation of the Elements in De Generatione Et Corruptione I. 1-4' (1995), Bostock interprets Aristotle's discussion of coming-to-be as based on the admission of prime matter (esp. 319a34-b4, 320a2-5), and points out that this interpretation runs into a problem because of Aristotle's implicit distinction between coming-to-be and alteration as types of transformation. For, on this interpretation, elemental coming-to-be and destruction (e.g. the coming-to-be of water from air) can be construed as an alteration of prime matter which loses one quality ('hot') and acquires another ('cold'). On Bostock's view, to avoid the inconsistency, Aristotle would need to agree that the four principal kinds of change are not mutually exclusive, and the same process can be described as coming-to-be in one respect and as alteration in another. Bostock could have noted that Aristotle elsewhere allows for the concomitance of the processes of change of different kinds (GC 1.5, discussion of locomotion). There may be a further difficulty to this 'concomitance' assumption: although the 'four kinds of change' are usually cited by Aristotle himself in this way, he does not treat generation on a par with alteration, locomotion and growth because, unlike them, it is not a kinêsis but a metabolê (Phys. 5.1). In any case, even if we admit concomitance (following GC 1.5), we still have to explain in what sense an elemental transformation instantiates the coming-to-be rather than the alteration. Bostock makes no suggestion in this regard. (Treating the elemental transformation as alteration seems not to be in keeping with the account he gives in GC 2.1-5.)

3. In 'Aristotle's Theory of Matter' (2001), Bostock sets out to formulate the criterion of identity for prime matter as that which 'underlies', in order to make the Aristotelian theory more consistent. His description of Aristotle's matter as 'filling space' is somewhat anachronistic, because Aristotle does not use the concept of three-dimensional space, although this description was applied to Aristotle's matter by some later thinkers. The criterion of identity for matter thus understood is that of spatio-temporal continuity throughout all transformations (the main example is elemental transformations). This suggestion might seem to be an answer to Wiggins's criticism of the notion of identity as spatio-temporal continuity, except that Bostock intends his definition for matter rather than substance, and does not mind, it seems, if the notion of 'matter' is understood in a collective sense (as the matter of all things in the limited cosmos, which will be the ultimate case of his spatial 'region' whose boundary will never be crossed by any transformation). This is a very interesting and ingenious rationalisation of Aristotle's concept of matter. There may be an exegetical problem in that, as Bostock himself seems to admit, this kind of concept does not necessarily depend on Aristotle's theory of matter (it could be applied, mutatis mutandis, to the atomist concept of matter as 'space filler' within the boundaries of an atom, and even more so to a geometrical version of corpuscularism such as the one described in Plato's Timaeus). Thus, it does not offer a specific defence of prime matter, but perhaps a generic defence of any concept of matter (which is not to diminish its philosophical interest and significance).

4. In 'Aristotle on Teleology in Nature' (new), Bostock surveys the explanatory function of final cause in Aristotle's physics. Bostock explains that Aristotle's concept of 'nature' understood as form and goal is necessary to account for the structure and functions of natural substances since the 'laws of matter' cannot provide a satisfactory account.

Bostock's discussion of Phys. 2.9 leads him to the conclusion, in contrast to PA 1.1, that Aristotle here denies simple necessity in nature and recognises hypothetical necessity as that by which matter is necessitated in the process of final causation. It is not clear to me that 'simple necessity' means the same in PA 1.1 where the context is predominantly logical (close to GC 2.11) and Phys. 2.9 where logical context is almost completely absent. On the basis of this interpretation of Phys. 2.9, Bostock sketches what he sees as a plausible version of Aristotle's system as 'extreme teleology' where the essential components of the cosmos taken as final causes would be sufficient to explain its full material constitution (spontaneous generation, predictably, does not fit into this picture and has to be left out). Bostock concludes by criticising some of the 'blinkers' of Aristotle's approach to this problem: (1) Aristotle does not concentrate on certain relevant phenomena, e.g. light or magnetism; and (2) he does not have the concept of the law of nature understood as a specific combination of factors at work. With respect to (1) it has to be said that the list of Aristotle's works contains 'On the lodestone', cf. also Alexander of Aphrodisias Quaest. 2.23 (which I discussed in 'Aristotelian dynamics in the 2nd century' (BICS Supplement 2004)). With respect to (2), it may be argued that Aristotle's treatment of natural cycles involves the notion of stable 'clusters' of concomitant causes belonging to different explanatory types.

5. In 'Aristotle's Theory of Form' (new), Bostock lists multiple problems with the theory of form and concludes that this theory, unlike Aristotle's theory of matter, was a 'complete failure'. In the logical works, eidos refers to species rather than form, and Aristotle does not give a clear logical criterion to distinguish form/species construed as essence from a non-essential property. In Physics 1, there is a similar problem with the use of form (as the contrary of privation) in the theory of change which covers both substantial and non-substantial changes. Bostock questions the link between form and natural end in the biological treatises and the consistency of the notion of inherited form with that of form-essence. The most serious criticisms are levelled at the definition of soul as form in De Anima 2.1. In Bostock's view, Aristotle's recourse to the analogy of the sailor and the ship in the discussion of intellect shows that he is not fully committed to the concept of soul as immanent form. Moreover, the interpretation of soul's explanatory role seems to be ridden with internal conflict. Bostock argues that the idea that soul is an efficient cause is clear when used to explain mental functions but does not fit well with the explanation of life functions (such as nutritive). Here it should be noted that Aristotle does describe the nutritive soul (in its role as provider of the appropriate type of concoction) as an efficient cause in GC 1.5, Meteor. 4.12 and a number of passages in biological treatises. However, it is interesting that once again, as in his discussion of matter, Bostock puts his finger on the type of bifurcation which was noticed and exploited in those ancient and medieval De Anima commentaries which point out functional differences between the vegetative and the sensitive soul. Bostock observes that Aristotle's notion of form has a number of parallels with the notion of DNA used in modern genetics to explain the phenotype of a living being, but points out that Aristotle's concept is meant to be stronger insofar as it explains a broader range of cases (from inanimate things to complex human behaviour). His conclusion is sceptical: there is nothing that could fit this description. It seems that the explanatory value of the concept of form is taken by Bostock as an empirical question, to be decided, ultimately, within the theoretical framework suggested by a modern scientific outlook. But even if this approach (not implausible, but not necessarily obvious) is granted, it seems that it should be possible -- especially when 'form' is vindicated by modern science -- to isolate its explanatory function and treat it on its own merits.

6. In 'Aristotle on the Eleatics in Physics I. 2-3' (new), Bostock raises the question about the reasons for Aristotle's attack on Melissus' use of conversion ('everything that has come to be has a starting point, so everything that has not come to be has no starting point'). This question could perhaps be answered on the basis of Aristotle's analysis of conversion ('all S are P' does not convert into 'all non-S are non-P'). The force of this argument (also questioned by Bostock) is explained by the link made in Melissus' argument (fr. 2) between the claim derived by conversion and the infinity thesis. The link seems fully traceable, so that Aristotle's objection targets the logical root of the thesis by criticising the conversion.

At 186a22-b12, Aristotle argues against Parmenides that even if it is granted that there is just one meaning of 'being', it cannot be shown that being is one. Bostock points out Aristotle's failure to use leukon in one meaning in 186a22-32. But more interesting, in my view, is the distinction between whiteness as 'being white' and 'to einai tôi dedegmenôi', elsewhere rendered as a distinction between 'the white [object]' and 'what it is to be white'.

Bostock asks a good exegetical question about the ending of chapter 3: how exactly does the theme of atoms, and especially indivisible objects as shown from the Dichotomy, relate to the preceding discussion, in which Aristotle mentions not Dichotomy but the other kind of indivisible objects, i.e., the indivisible eidê, substances understood as species and genera? Perhaps Aristotle wanted to draw attention to the contrast between atomism and his own 'acceptance of both principles' (being and not being, as constitutive of change).

7. 'Aristotle, Zeno, and the Potential Infinite' (1972) challenges Aristotle's solution to Zeno's paradox of motion (in Phys. 8.8, 263a-b4), according to which an infinite series of tasks cannot be completed, and defends the thesis that it is possible to give a logical construal of such completed infinite series. Bostock illustrates an infinite series with the example of regular extinguishing oscillations represented by a converging series (but the reader can compare other versions of 'infinity machines' discussed by M. Black, W. Salmon and others). The major difficulty that makes the idea of completion of such a series hard to accept is that it is impossible, given the full description of the system in its initial state, to obtain its equally full description at the final state (when the infinite series has been completed). The system with determinate initial parameters thus seems to be indeterministic, and this counterintuitive consequence inclines us to accept Aristotle's reasoning. In the 2006 note Bostock endorses his earlier analysis and adds some points concerning the actual infinity of numbers and time, drawing on his own later work (see below).

8. In 'A Note on Aristotle's Account of Place', Bostock objects to Ben Morison's interpretation of the second meaning of place in Aristotle ('the limit of the first unmoved') as the first heaven and suggests instead to understand this as the limit of the minimal surrounding body. I am attracted to this elegant clarification of an obscure passage, but at the same time find it difficult to see how it will work for Aristotle, for whom even the minimal surrounding body is still physical rather than geometrical, hence probablywould not qualify as 'the first unmoved'.

9. In 'Aristotle's Account of Time' (1980), Bostock raises two exegetical questions -- (i) why does Aristotle call time 'a kind of number' (arithmos tis) and (ii) why does he call 'now' a number? -- for which he attempts to find systematic solutions. He finds the possible solutions that (i) time is a kind of number in the sense that it is a kind of measurable duration and (ii) 'now' is like a number because it is also a universal (the relevant aspect of 'number' in this analogy) -- not fully satisfying. The first fails because the terminological overlap it involves is unnatural in Greek usage and uncharacteristic of Aristotle who usually distinguishes between arithmos and megethos, as the objects of the distinct disciplines arithmetic and geometry, respectively. The second is unsatisfactory because it is based on the ambivalent treatment of the function of 'now' as a limit and as a number: the former makes the 'now' an aspect of an individual duration interval, while the latter makes it a universal. In the additional note written for this volume, Bostock expresses his hope that the problem will draw the attention of Aristotle scholars. The volume was probably in press roughly at the same time as Ursula Coope's recent monograph devoted to Physics 4.10-14, where the analysis of the numbering function of the 'now' has many parallels with Bostock's (including the admission of some unresolved exegetical difficulties in 220a21-4, Time for Aristotle, OUP, 2005, 113-24), while making an attempt to resolve the tension between the 'limiting' and 'numbering' functions of the 'now'.

10. In 'Aristotle on Continuity in Physics VI' (1991), Bostock sets out to reconstruct the definition of continuum which underlies the principle of infinite divisibility and shows that the definition in Physics 5.3 may lead to some remarkable breaches of the principle, exhibiting a point as a proper part of division. Pursuing this analysis further, Bostock shows that this result is consistent with the demonstration of the concept of real number by the method of Dedekind's cut. Aristotle obviously had no such technique at his disposal and his recourse to the intuitive representation of continuum as infinitely divisible is understandable, but Bostock thinks that Aristotle should get credit for the attempt to study the idea underlying the modern mathematical concept of connectedness. The rest of the paper is devoted to the applications of this idea of continuum to change, place and time. Bostock shows some flaws in the argument for the continuity of time and space, outlines problems with the idea that no motion or rest can be said to take place at an instant, and analyses the theses that every change takes time and every object of change has parts. Bostock points out certain inconsistencies between the doctrine of change in Physics 6 and in other books of the Physics (notably, Book 3, on the idea of actual infinity, and Book 8.3). He suggests that Book 6 is earlier than the other books of the Physics, tracing the influence of Plato's discussion of change in the second part of Parmenides. According to his suggestion, in Physics 6, Aristotle provides a first version of his response to the puzzles raised by Plato (subsequently revising some of his positions). This suggestion may prove a valuable contribution to the study of the discussions of division and divisibility in the Academy.

All in all, this is a very useful publication. There is clearly a unity of vision which underlies these different studies, and it is good to have them collected in a book. Both the choice of topics and the high quality of discussion make it indispensable reading for all serious students of Aristotle.

The typesetting is superb: the only misprint I noticed is the incorrect accent in hôrismenos which should be a paroxytone (p. 143, line 13). Although all the essays in the volume are well focussed on the designated texts of Aristotle, an index locorum would not be superfluous.