Sparing Civilians

Placeholder book cover

Seth Lazar, Sparing Civilians, Oxford University Press, 2015, 158pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198712985.

Reviewed by Peter Tramel, Fort Hays State University


The first sentence and straightforward thesis of this book are the same: "Killing civilians is worse than killing soldiers." To be clear, the context is killing enemy soldiers for the sake of winning a war. Nothing in the book suggests that the author would apply his thesis to ordinary murder cases. Presumably, if A kills B solely for the sake of robbing B or because A raped B and then kills B to silence her as a witness, then it should not matter who is a civilian or who is a soldier. It would not hurt for the author to be clearer about that.

It might seem obvious that killing civilians for the sake of winning a war is worse than killing soldiers. It is a mainstay of traditional just war theory and international law, and the Press tend to take it for granted. Yet, more often than not, when wars break out we soon see civilians being slaughtered indiscriminately, and we see generals, politicians, lawyers, and even some just war theorists defending the slaughter. Usually they defend the slaughter by broadening the permissibility of "collateral damage," but when that is no longer plausible they may even go so far as U.S. World War II General Curtis LeMay, who defended his frequently indiscriminate bombing of Japan from 1944-1945 by declaring that there are no "innocent" Japanese.

One reason this may happen is because war increases practical and political pressure on decision-makers to reason purely instrumentally, and from a purely instrumental point of view killing civilians is not necessarily, and in fact not always, worse than killing soldiers, even if it often is. But Seth Lazar maintains, in keeping with mainstream just war theory, that there are natural human rights and so it is never permissible to think of any human beings as mere opportunities to realize agent-neutral, instrumental values. Instrumental considerations matter; but so do non-instrumental ones. They must be brought into an equilibrium where neither is short-changed. He never puts it quite that way, but much of the genius of this book lies in the innovative way he conceives and pursues that goal.

He argues that killing civilians is worse than killing soldiers for a plurality of reasons. No one kind of reason is the main one. No one kind of reason is universal, although some are almost universal. In almost every situation there is at least one sufficient reason why killing civilians is worse than killing soldiers. A brief summary of his arguments can take the form of a disjunction: killing civilians is worse than killing soldiers because either (Chapter 2) killing the soldiers is usually necessary -- i.e., essential for winning the war -- but killing the civilians is not, or (Chapter 3) killing the soldiers is usually eliminative but killing the civilians is opportunistic, which is worse, or (Chapter 4) killing the civilians usually requires a greater risk of violating the rights of innocents than killing the soldiers, or (Chapter 5) it is worse to kill the vulnerable and defenseless, and civilians are generally more vulnerable and defenseless than soldiers. Moreover, (Chapter 6) it is part of the very nature and function of being a soldier to belong to a group that is more dangerous, in control, and responsible for events than civilians, and it is part of the very nature and function of being a soldier to be protectors of civilians -- to stand between adversaries and civilians saying, in effect, "fight us, not them."

In the introductory first chapter, Lazar argues against traditional views on which there is a single reason why killing civilians is worse than killing soldiers. Especially, he argues against Michael Walzer's view that soldiers are more liable to harm because of the greater threat they pose to us, and he argues against Jeff McMahan's view that soldiers in an unjust cause are more liable to harm than civilians because of their greater responsibility for the threat they pose. He argues that neither of these views fully explains why it is worse to kill civilians than soldiers, and neither one is sufficient for all of the cases in which it is worse to kill civilians than soldiers. Killing civilians is often even worse than killing soldiers who do not pose a threat to us, and killing civilians is often even worse than killing just combatants -- soldiers who fight justly, in a just cause, on the orders of a legitimate authority, etc.

This first chapter is key in many ways to understanding the larger project of the book. The author does not propose an alternative account of liability to harm or the combatant / noncombatant distinction. Lazar argues, instead, that we cannot get to a good account of these more technical matters until we first do justice to the more fundamental question of why killing civilians is almost always worse than killing soldiers. So he tackles that more fundamental question. If he plans a sequel in which he goes on to build a theory of liability to harm in war, etc., then he sets it up admirably with this book.

In the second chapter, "Necessity," he argues that killing enemy soldiers is often necessary for the sake of winning a war but killing civilians in an enemy country usually is not. In World War II, bombing campaigns against cities, such as the British and American bombings of German cities, failed for various reasons to produce the desired result of turning enemy civilians against their war effort or their government. In counterinsurgencies, killing civilians can be counterproductive, increasing local and international sympathy for the insurgency. However, Lazar argues that killing civilians has sometimes been effective, and perhaps necessary, for winning wars -- for instance in the Second Boer War, when the British convinced Boer guerillas that the cost of insurgency was too high by victimizing their families, who were defenseless so long as their men were out conducting guerilla warfare. Necessity is often one of the reasons why killing soldiers is worse than killing civilians; but not always.

Lazar's discussion of opportunistic vs. eliminative killing in the third chapter has potentially broad implications for ethics in general. Opportunistic killing is done in order to derive a benefit that the killer could not have enjoyed in the victim's absence (59). For instance, in the case where I would have to push a heavy man in front of a trolley, killing him, in order to stop the trolley and save five people down the line, pushing him would be opportunistic killing. I would not have this means of saving the five people if that heavy man was not conveniently there, and conveniently heavy enough, to be victimized by me for this purpose. On the other hand, eliminative killing is done in order to derive a benefit that the killer could have achieved in the victim's absence. In the case where I save five people by diverting the trolley onto a line where only one person will be killed, I kill eliminatively. I could have saved the five people by this means without killing anyone, if only that one person was not tragically on that other line. Opportunistic killing is worse than eliminative killing. It requires a preference for victimization in the pursuit of the killer's ends that eliminative killing does not; and thus opportunistic killing treats victims as mere means -- mere opportunities to achieve value -- in a way that eliminative killing does not.

Usually, but not always, killing civilians is done opportunistically; for instance when it is done to frighten or anger them into ceasing to support their government or their local insurgents. Usually, killing soldiers is done eliminatively; for instance because they simply stand in the way of some important military objective, such as control of a hill or a city we need to take to win the war. We would gladly occupy that hill or city without killing anyone if enemy soldiers were not there blocking the way with their lives. On the other hand, we could not use killing civilians as a weapon against the enemy government or insurgency if they weren't there. One important exception to this would be killing civilians that the enemy uses as "human shields," in order to protect vital military targets by imposing a high public relations cost on us. Killing civilians in that kind of case would be eliminative, but some of the other reasons why killing civilians is worse than killing soldiers would still apply.

In Chapter 4, Lazar turns to considerations of risk. He argues that killing civilians is often worse than killing soldiers because when we kill civilians we take a greater risk of killing innocents than when we kill soldiers. Also, when we kill civilians we take a greater risk that killing them will not help us achieve our goals than when we kill soldiers. Of course some soldiers are less guilty than some soldiers for the threat they pose to us, and the killing of some civilians may contribute more to our chances for victory than the killing of some soldiers. But we're rarely in an epistemic position to do more than roughly estimate the odds in either kind of case, especially if we're in the fog of war. We should almost always conclude, based on the evidence at hand at the time, that killing civilians involves much greater moral risk, in terms of both killing innocents and killing unnecessarily, than killing soldiers.

In Chapter 5, Lazar argues that the greater vulnerability and defenselessness of civilians often makes it worse to kill them than soldiers. Soldiers are often vulnerable and defenseless too -- like Walzer's famous "naked soldier," who thinks he has found a safe moment to take a bath. However, there are often reasons why it is still worse to kill the vulnerable and defenseless civilian than the vulnerable and defenseless soldier. For instance, we have a prima facie (overrideable) duty not to harm vulnerable and defenseless people, but we have such a duty to protect them only if (or more strongly if) they are civilians, not if (or less strongly if) they are enemy soldiers.

The final chapter deals directly with the other side of the coin. If there are reasons why it is often worse to kill civilians than soldiers, then there must be reasons why it is often more permissible to kill soldiers than civilians. Lazar argues that these reasons stem from the greater control soldiers have over their involvement in wars and the role they play as a special kind of public servant. To some extent, soldiers allow themselves to become dangerous people (Walzer's "dangerous men"). On the virtuous side of the military profession, when people allow themselves to become soldiers, they bravely offer to be protectors of civilians. To all potential enemies, just or unjust, they say, in effect, "fight us, not civilians". They are prima facie more liable to harm both because of the civilian responsibilities they have abandoned and the new responsibilities of public service they have taken on.

This book will make a difference in the future of just war theory. It is an important challenge to the basic assumptions of the leading contemporary just war theorists, and it is an indictment against their starting points. It is well written and its readability is enhanced by its avoidance of the technical language of most contemporary discussions of just war theory. The author can avoid technical and specialist language because his challenge is at a primitive level, factually and maybe logically prior to the level of most contemporary work in the field. Moreover, this book is innovative concerning how to do applied ethics more generally. Everyone in ethics will be interested in the author's discussions of opportunistic vs. eliminative killing in Chapter 3 and the thought experiments in his discussion of risk in Chapter 4.