Speaking My Mind: Expression and Self-Knowledge

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Dorit Bar-On, Speaking My Mind: Expression and Self-Knowledge, Oxford University Press, 2005, 464pp., $47.50 (pbk), ISBN 0199276285.
University of Minnesota

Reviewed by Joseph Owens, University of Minnesota


In this ambitious book, Dorit Bar-On articulates and defends an account of avowals, first person, present tense, ascriptions of occurrent mental states, ascriptions such as, "I am in pain." These ascriptions are problematic in that they seem to be immune to challenge, in no need of justification, indeed presumed true (when sincere). This, even though I use such ascriptions to make perfectly unremarkable contingent claims about myself, claims which have no special status when made by someone else about me.

This special character of avowals is traditionally accounted for in epistemic terms, in terms of the alleged special access a subject has to her own inner states of mind -- be they propositional attitudes, phenomenal states, etc. I am supposed to have access to my own occurrent mental states by way of some introspective mechanism, while others have to infer my beliefs, etc. from my behavior, what I say and do, from the character of my proximate environment, etc. The special reliability (incorrigibility or whatever) of my first person reports simply reflects the reliability of my access -- leaving no room for challenge. Elements of this story -- especially the peculiar immaterial character of the inner states -- have largely been abandoned as nonscientific, but the general framework has, more often than not, been retained: each subject has special access to her inner states, and it is this special access that underwrites the supposition that first person avowals are true, while others who have access only to what the subject says and does are in no position to challenge such avowals. Variations on this approach (appeals to inner scanners, monitors, etc.), which Bar-on labels the epistemic account, have been offered by identity theorists, functionalists, etc. She rejects wholesale all such epistemic accounts.

She begins her story with an extended discussion of a different but related phenomenon, the security with which a speaker singles herself out in utterances of the form "I am A-ing" (thinking, acting, etc.). Here, too, theorists in the Cartesian mold think of this security as arising from some special epistemic access to an ego or whatever, but such accounts have little attraction today. By way of contrast, and drawing on the work of Evans and Shoemaker, Bar-on sees the key to this phenomenon of self-reference as arising not from some special inner identification of the subject, but rather from the fact that the subject stands in no genuine need of identification at all. In a non-self-referential judgment of the form "N is A-ing" in which "N" is, for example, a name or description, we can distinguish between two elements: we can think of the subject as judging (i) that someone is A-ing, and (ii) that this someone is N, that it is N that is A-ing. We can think of the subject as having grounds for (i) that are quite different and more reliable than her grounds for (ii). In such judgments we can speak of possible error of misidentification -- cases in which she has grounds for the more basic judgment (i), but her misidentification of N undermines the second judgment. The story is quite different, however, in the judgment that I am A-ing; here there is simply no room for this kind of error of misidentification for the simple reason that I, the subject, have no grounds for thinking that someone is A-ing independent of my grounds for thinking that I am A-ing. A certain kind of error is eliminated but not through any special epistemic access the subject has to herself.

Bar-on extends this intuition to the rest of the self-ascription. My determination that I believe that it is about to rain is not the product of (i) my determination that I hold some attitude towards some content or other, and my further determination (ii) that the attitude in question is belief, and that the content of that belief is that it's about to rain; my grounds for thinking that I hold an attitude towards some content or other are simply whatever grounds I have for thinking that I believe that it is about to rain. Just as there was no room for misidentifying the referent of "I" so here there is no room for misidentifying the content or the character of my attitudes. So we have it that such avowals are immune to a certain kind of error -- errors of "misdescription." But of course, to argue that avowals are not open to a certain kind of error does not explain why it is we think of avowals as true, nor does it justify the intuition that avowals constitute self-knowledge. She seeks to explain these further points by offering an account of avowals as speech acts of a certain kind -- actions that serve to express mental states. (For reasons of space, I will not discuss her treatment of self-knowledge).

In construing avowals as expressive acts, Bar-on is following a familiar route. Traditional expressive accounts (labeled "simple expressive" accounts) construed avowals as being analogous to grunts and groans, cries of pain, pleasure etc. and, as such, avowals could not be false or challenged for the simple reason that they do not serve to make claims. This understanding of avowals as being neither true nor false is, however, strikingly counterintuitive, and Bar-On attempts to fashion her account in such a way as to draw on the genuine insights of the expressivists, while rejecting their construal of avowals as neither true nor false. To this end she distinguishes sharply between the act of avowing, and the product of the action -- a sentence which expresses or encodes a claim such as that one believes that it is about to rain, a claim which is true or false as the case may be.

In sincerely uttering "I believe that P" I am, on this account, expressing, in the action-sense, my belief that P, and this act of expressing is to be distinguished from reporting P, promising P, describing P, asserting P, etc. Bar-On offers no general account of exactly what is involved in such acts of expression (which she dubs "expression1"), but instead explicates this notion by considering a wide range of examples, examples intended to display a continuity between primitive forms of psychological expression (groans, etc.), and avowals proper. At one end of the spectrum we have groans and moans of pleasure and pain, winces, facial expressions, etc., we have primitive conventional forms, "ouch", "ah", "wow", etc., then slightly more articulated forms, "oh god", "gorgeous", "awful"; finally we have agents employing conventional linguistic forms to express their states in avowals proper, to express them by uttering sentences such as: "I can't believe it", "I want help", "I am in pain", "I believe that this is the end", "I wish that you would return", and so on. She also offers us a range of characterizations of what it is one is doing when one engages in such expressive behavior: we may describe the agent as expressing her mental states, as venting them, as giving voice to them, as speaking from or out of them, and so on. This epistemologically unmediated expressive/venting character of the acts explains why it is one does not need to supply reasons for such utterances, as one would if one were engaged in reporting or describing inner events and states.

Moreover, these expressions of one's inner states are not only straight from or out of these inner states, without the mediation of some introspective process of discrimination, but, on this account, they serve to show one's occurrent mental states to the other. These actions serve to show "not merely in the sense of showing observers that behaving subjects are in the relevant mental states, but also in the sense of enabling observers to perceive the mental states." (p. 277. Italics mine). In her terminology, the expressive behavior is said "to be transparent-to-the-subject's-condition." (p. 312)

Unlike the simple expressivist, Bar-on claims to be able to accommodate our intuition that avowals are true or false. We must take into account not merely the expressive act of avowing, but also the product of such actions: an avowal as product is a sentence of the form "I am in mental state M," and as such it expresses, in the semantic sense (express3) the proposition that I am in M, and is true if and only if I am in M. We can now put this together with her remarks on transparency to explain why it is that avowals are ordinarily taken to be true (not just immune to a certain kind of error). To put it succinctly, a subject's utterance of the form "I am in M" is, in ordinary circumstances, taken to be true, because in expressing her belief, the subject's "behavior is transparent to the subject's condition"; in this action we can, so to speak, perceive the subject's being in M, the very state her utterance (product) says she is in. We can "see" in her expressive behavior (her avowing that she is in M) that what she claims (via the product) is true. Thus the special security of the avowals is obtained without postulating some special inner introspective eye.

In the final chapter, Bar-on takes up the issue of ontology, addressing concerns that arise from the close link she draws between the subject's mental states and her behavior -- her behavior which serves to express her mental states. There is a temptation to think that if one is really going to suppose that mental states can be expressed in behavior, in such a way that the audience may be said to perceive the mental in the behavior, then one cannot think of mental states as independent states that causally produce such behavior. It is temping to think that the account commits one to some form of behaviorism -- to identifying the individual's inclinations to various expressive behaviors with her being in pain, with her believing that such and such, etc. Bar-On agrees that, on her account, mental states are not inner states that simply cause behaviors of this or that characteristic form (p. 423); she seems to agree that they are in some sense conceptually linked to behavior, but she denies that this commits her to behaviorism or other forms of anti-realism regarding the mental. The notion of mental condition, she writes, "is neither the notion of some internal state (material or not), nor the notion of a disposition to certain kinds of behavior" (p. 424). She offers little by way of a positive account of how mental states are to be construed in her expressive theory.

These ontological issues -- the status of the mental, the nature of human action, and the conceptual linkages between the two -- are really at the heart of the project and its success or failure. If one grants Bar-On's picture of the mind, a picture in which we can perceive the mental in the actions of another, then indeed the rest of the story may fall into line. While I am sympathetic to the way in which she links mind and action, there are serious difficulties to be confronted. First, an epistemological issue. She assumes throughout the account that we can hear what people say (not mere noises), we can see what they are doing (not mere skeletal movements), etc., i.e., she assumes that we can perceive behavior as individuated in these intentional categories. From this it may seem just a small step to supposing that we can perceive the mind of another in her behavior, to supposing that we can see her intentions, beliefs, etc. in her expressions of them,. While I am sympathetic to this general picture, it can hardly be assumed in the present context. It cannot be assumed against the theorist who responds: The problem, as I see it, is this: I encounter S; I don't know what her mental life is like, and I have to try to figure it out from her behavior. In doing this, I cannot assume knowledge of what it is she is doing and saying, when these are intentionally characterized -- to assume such knowledge is to assume knowledge of her mental life. The behavioral data available to me in this project is of a much more primitive sort: it is simply S's behavior when this is characterized in non-intentional terminology, as noises, etc. And, we cannot perceive her mind in her behavior when it is individuated in this fashion.

The second problem is the metaphysical problem of the linkage between mind and action. On her account, mental states are not mere causes of behavior, to be inferred from the behavior, nor are they identified with behavioral dispositions. What are they, and what is the nature of the linkage? To be told that they are expressed in behavior, that we can see through the behavior to the mental, does not really seem to help very much -- it seems to do little more than stick a name on the relation. The problem here is, I think, analogous to the problem posed by Wittgenstein's use of the term "criteria." Clearly, Wittgenstein was on to something of importance, when he used this term in discussing the intimacy and complexity of the mental-behavioral relations. But he left no clear independent account of this notion, as is evidenced by the last fifty years of scholarship. There is, I think, little doubt but that we still don't have any clear notion of what exactly is being claimed when we claim that such and such serve as criteria for this or that. Likewise with the term "expresses." But then she is in good company.

As noted at the outset, this is an ambitious book; indeed it is even more ambitious than indicated so far. In addition to the topics mentioned above she also has extended discussions of ethical expressiveness, of psychological externalism, etc. It is ambitious, it is long, and it is difficult, but it is well worth the effort. This is a rich book; rich in topics, in argumentation, and in philosophical imagination and insight. It deserves the attention of all who work in mind and language.