Speaking of Freedom: Philosophy, Politics, and the Struggle for Liberation

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Diane Enns, Speaking of Freedom: Philosophy, Politics, and the Struggle for Liberation, Stanford University Press, 2007, 200pp., $55.00, ISBN 0804754659.

Reviewed by Todd May, Clemson University


One of the more urgent questions facing philosophy at this time is that of the relation between philosophy and political practice.  It is a question that is not asked enough.  Too often, philosophers seem to feel that their task is done when they have articulated a philosophical approach to politics.  If the world does not measure up to their approach, then that is the world's problem.

Diane Enns has resisted this temptation in her intriguing book Speaking of Freedom.  At the center of the book is the question of the relation of philosophy and political practice, or, as she sometimes puts it, the relation of freedom and freedoms.  She offers a sensitive reading of several recent chapters in the history of that relation, and suggests an approach, derived from Derrida, that merits serious consideration.

Professor Enns starts her inquiry with a reflection on the way freedom is characterized in the writings of Sartre, Beauvoir, and Merleau-Ponty.  This may seem like ancient history to some.  However, she makes it clear that the legacy of this period, and particularly of Sartre's writings, remains with us politically.  Her treatment of these thinkers is not new, but it serves to remind us of the distinction between Merleau-Ponty's more nuanced concept of situated freedom and Sartre's stark positing of freedom as individual self-assertion over and against the other.  (In her account, Beauvoir occupies a sort of middle place between the two.)  Freedom, for Sartre, does not arise within situations but against them, requiring at once transcendence from and opposition to the contexts in which one finds oneself.  For Enns, this view provides an influential underpinning for anti-colonialist movements, particularly in Francophone Africa, and through them for the identity politics of the 1980s and 1990s.  This view runs counter to the position that holds people like Foucault intellectually responsible for identity politics, and in my view is much more compelling.  There are two reasons for this.  First, the theoretical link between Sartre and identity politics is stronger than Foucault's more supple political approach.  Second, this view shows how the context of political practice itself, in the form of anti-colonialist movements, is linked to a politics of self-assertion.

The second chapter of the book takes up the themes of transcendence and opposition as they appear in the anti-colonialist writings of Frantz Fannon and Albert Memmi.  Enns remarks that,

A common ethos appears in the writings of actors in the midst of these experiences:  one that highlights a self-determined, autonomous subject, an authentic consciousness, an understanding of oppression as dehumanization, and a subject/object relation that is inherently antagonistic or violent. (p. 52) 

These, of course are Sartrean themes.  Enns shows the theoretical link between these writings and the later practices of Black Consciousness in South Africa and U.S. feminism of the 1960s and 1970s.

The third chapter turns to Foucault.  It is, to my mind, the least successful section of the book.  I should confess, however, that my own orientation is Foucaultian rather than Derridean, so I am more likely to give a sympathetic reading to the ambiguities and tensions in Foucault's thought than the one that appears here.  Enns points out that, while Foucault offers nuanced historical writings that undercut many of the themes that animate Sartre's political approach -- for example, the subject/object distinction and the idea of freedom as transcendence -- there are two important limitations to his thought.  First, when Foucault addresses issues of oppression and resistance in contemporary politics (e.g., Tunisian students or the Iranian revolution) he returns to the traditional political approach that his writings subvert.  Second, and related, he offers no coherent account of freedom.  Enns suggests that there is something in Foucault's larger approach that makes it difficult for him to deal with political practice on a larger stage:  for example, that of colonialism, imperialism, or domination.  However, this suggestion is not worked through.  The chapter is content to point out the tensions between his public comments and his analyses, and to suggest that at the end of his life he returns to an individualist position of the kind embraced by Sartre.  This last suggestion relies on the mistaken premise that Foucault's late writings about the ancient Greeks endorse the positions he describes, an endorsement Foucault explicitly disavows.

Enns finds a more promising approach to thinking about the relation of philosophy and political practice in Derrida (although, it should be noted, she is not an uncritical reader of Derrida).  She is particularly sympathetic to Derrida's approach to politics in Spectres of Marx.  There he rejects what she calls an "egological politics" -- a politics of self-assertion -- for a politics that holds together the poles of an emancipatory desire and a recognition of the other.  The balance Enns finds Derrida articulating is between political self-assertion and its limits.  On the one hand, political resistance emerges from a desire for emancipation, for freedom.  On the other hand, that desire must recognize that the subject who desires is already constituted by otherness.  Therefore, emancipation cannot happen over and against the other but must recognize the other who one also is.  This recognition is not a theoretical accounting but rather a respect for what cannot be given adequate articulation.  It is, to use the later terms Enns invokes from Derrida, a messianicity without messianism, a hope and desire without a utopia that would settle accounts once and for all.

In the book's final chapter, Enns shows how the writings of the Zapatistas and particularly Subcommandante Marcos seem to embody this messianicity without messianism.  "There are moments," she writes,

in the EZLN communiqués to the world in which one can glimpse the faith in a freedom not utopian, but á-venir, an expectation irreducible to knowledge that points to a political transformation that affirms a promise as promise and not as teleological design. (p. 147)

But here again, Enns is not uncritical.  There are other moments in these writings and in the practice of the Zapatistas that recall earlier, more Sartrean themes of self-assertion and transcendence.  What the Zapatistas offer is not a model but a suggestion, one that must be approached with vigilance, as all politics must be approached.  Or, as she says in her conclusion, "What is necessary, however, is as Derrida suggests a desire for justice and a freedom that we know will never be 'pure' or absolutely achieved.  This is the desire that will maintain freedom and politics as a question."  (p. 155)

Speaking of Freedom is an important book, as much for the questions it raises as for the answers it gives.  I would like to raise a question to those answers, but not because I think they are obviously mistaken.  Rather, it is because the significance of the project requires us to maintain a critical engagement with it, an engagement that Enns would no doubt be the first to endorse.  The question arises from the book's approach to political practice.  What is recounted in the second and fifth chapters are not so much examples of political intervention as of writings by those involved in political intervention.  The movement of the book, then, is not so much between philosophy and political practice as between philosophy and political writings.  This leaves open the question of the relation between philosophy and political writings on the one hand and political practice on the other.  How is it that the Derridean vigilance Enns endorses is to be carried into political practice?

The problem here may be seen, perhaps a bit crudely, as one of application.  There is an element of political practice that requires a decision, a self-assertion of the kind that Enns wants to temper.  She is surely right to suggest that the history of that self-assertion is troubling.  But one wonders how it is that the "without messianism" aspect of resistance is to be integrated into the "messianicity" that animates it.  How, for instance, are the Palestinians or the Zapatistas to temper their resistance in light of the deconstruction of subject and object that Derrida provides?  It is difficult to envision.  This is not to suggest either that tempering is not in order or that Enns' suggestion is incoherent or impossible.  Rather, it is to wonder how helpful this model might be to political practice.  How is it that the decision to resist is to "maintain freedom and politics as a question"?  I wonder whether, in the face of this practical political question, a Derridean approach might face the same difficulty Enns ascribes to Foucault, that of how to integrate the theoretical into the practical in the context of an unfolding movement of political resistance.

If this is right, then we must seek our conceptual fortunes elsewhere, for reasons of political practice rather than of philosophical coherence.  For my own part, the writings of Jacques Rancière provide a suggestive alternative.  However, the very fact that this is a fair question to raise to Enns is already a testimony to her work.  It is, after all, inherent to the project of her book to go beyond the question of philosophical coherence to that of the philosophical/practical relation.  If she has not seen her way to practice far enough yet, then she has at the very least gone much farther than most philosophers dare.  For that alone, the book is a worthy contribution to political theory.