Speculation: Within and About Science

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Peter Achinstein, Speculation: Within and About Science, Oxford University Press, 2019, 276pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190615055.

Reviewed by Chris Haufe, Case Western Reserve University


Anyone interested in the history of science will be well-acquainted with the centrality of speculation to the growth of scientific knowledge. Using notebooks, correspondence, and meeting transcripts, the last few generations of historians have painstakingly chronicled the evolution of particular ideas, revealing a steady flow of speculative thought leading up to major advances in the natural sciences and in mathematics. These studies often depict a cycle of speculation marked by two periods: first, a tendency for the range of speculation to become increasingly narrow as time, reflection, and experience conspire to drive the boundaries of the possible closer and closer together; second, a return to wide-ranging speculative thought once practitioners have become reasonably confident in the pursuit-worthiness of a particular way of approaching the study of nature.

The history of second-order reflections on speculation has also attracted interest among those who study scientific knowledge, and here the historical record is substantially older than that which documents the active role of speculation in scientific investigation. As the 16th century drew to a close, it became increasingly chic to vituperate the sins of speculation in reaction to a long history of relatively lax empirical constraints on inquiry. Scientific revolutionaries like Bacon, Galileo, Boyle, Hooke, and Newton spared little abuse in their broadsides against the propriety of speculative thought in the study of nature. Typically, those who reflected on the epistemology of inquiry had no trouble convincing themselves that speculation and knowledge of nature were completely at odds with one another, and that no self-respecting natural philosopher would dare to entertain empirical claims that were not strictly implied by their observations. Protests to the contrary, we know from a combination of historical documents, philosophical argument, and plain old common sense that their published remarks were not uniformly consistent with the way in which they pursued scientific knowledge, which involved varying degrees of speculative thought at different stages of inquiry. By contrast, contemporary practitioners frequently go out of their way in their reflections on methodology to emphasize the view that bold, speculative thinking is what pushes scientific inquiry into new territory. One wonders what their predecessors would say about speculation now, were they to be confronted with the advances made by later generations who were convinced of its significance.

Peter Achinstein considers both the history of speculation and reflections on it in his new book. Surprisingly, he goes beyond looking at the role of speculation in science to examine "speculation about science," which includes certain debates within the philosophy of science as well as various positions taken by scientists and philosophers concerning a "theory of everything." Given its long and storied history, a careful philosophical examination of speculation's contribution to the growth of scientific knowledge is well-conceived, if not overdue. But while Achinstein can be credited with initiating a philosophical discussion of how to think about the role of speculation from a "classical philosophy of science" perspective (as opposed to the "new age" approach of just describing something that some scientists do sometimes), I think such a careful examination still awaits us. The most interesting and cutting-edge ideas are scarcely developed, and the book suffers from a number of defects which together make it a fairly low-yield investment of readers' time.

Among the notable contributions is the first chapter's working definition of speculation, which Achinstein then employs in different contexts as the book unfolds. On his account, the distinguishing features of a speculation are that it (1) "contain[s] assumptions about objects and their behavior for which there is no known evidence," and that it is (2) "introduced for purposes of explaining, predicting, and organizing phenomena" (6-8). Furthermore, speculations are supposed to come in two varieties: a "truth-relevant" variety, where introducers "believe that the assumptions are either true, or close to the truth, or possible candidates for the truth that are worth considering," and a "truth-irrelevant" variety in which introducers give no consideration whatsoever to the assumption's relation to the truth (ibid.).

I found the decision to classify "truth-irrelevant" assumptions as speculations to be jarringly unintuitive, such that what a speculation was immediately became less clear to me. Achinstein's exemplar for a truth-irrelevant speculation is the incompressible electrical fluid described by Maxwell in his 1855 "On Faraday's Lines of Force." As described by Achinstein, the purpose of Maxwell's article was to "construct a physical analogue of electrical and magnetic fields" which would allow him to study them using the mathematics of fluid dynamics. By approaching a magnetic field's lines of force as one would the flow of a fluid, Maxwell was able to develop a framework for the mathematical treatment of fields that had already proven itself effective in other contexts. His intentions in appealing to the mathematics of fluids are made very clear, and he goes out of his way to emphasize that what fluids offer us is an off-the-shelf way of studying anything with properties similar to those of fluids:

The substance here treated of must not be assumed to possess any of the properties of ordinary fluids except those of freedom of movement and resistance to compression. It is not even a hypothetical fluid which is introduced to explain actual phenomena. It is merely a collection of imaginary properties which may be employed for establishing certain theorems in pure mathematics in a way more intelligible to many minds and more applicable to physical problems than that in which algebraic symbols alone are used. The use of the word "Fluid" will not lead us into error, if we remember that it denotes a purely imaginary substance with the following property: The portion of fluid which at any instant occupies a given volume, will at any succeeding instant occupy an equal volume. This law expresses the incompressibility of the fluid and furnishes us with a convenient measure of its quantity, namely its volume. (Maxwell 1855: 160; his emphasis).

I guess I'll just say it: what would lead someone to classify this as a speculation? Achinstein himself acknowledges that "some readers . . . might prefer . . . a different term -- e.g. 'imaginary construction' -- for truth-irrelevant" speculations (as Maxwell apparently does). And, indeed, it is difficult to find fault with such a preference. Maxwell is no more speculating here than is Shakespeare when he portrays Hamlet as being of noble birth. Achinstein defends the decision to classify this practice as speculation on the grounds that, like "truth-relevant speculation," assumptions in these truth-irrelevant cases also lack evidence and are used for predicting, explaining, unifying, etc. But is it really appropriate to describe an "imaginary construction" as "lacking evidence" in some way? That seems like a stretch. If someone were to ask whether there was any evidence that Hamlet was of noble birth, we would rightly wonder if she understood what it meant for something to be a work of fiction. Like Maxwell's "incompressible fluid," Hamlet "is not even a hypothetical"; lacking evidence is not really something he's set up for. For reasons best known to himself, Achinstein has chosen to assert the relevance of evidence for and against fictional entities in order to drag them under the same umbrella that includes textbook speculations. The result is confusion rather than clarity.

This marks the first of a series of classificatory choices which together make it extremely difficult to discern a clear subject matter toward which this book is oriented. Another such choice regards the decision to characterize the philosophical theses of evidential holism and particularism as "speculations about science" (Chapter 4). Since evidential holism and particularism are no more or less speculative than most philosophical theories about science, and since it is patently perverse to classify philosophical theories about science as "speculations about science," one can only conclude that Achinstein has simply endeavored to portray evidential holism and particularism as instances of speculation in order to include this chapter in a book titled Speculation. He claims that they are truth-relevant speculations in the sense that proponents who believe them lack the kind of evidence which could be used by anyone in their epistemic situation to justify such beliefs. Whether or not one is keen to accept this characterization as an instance of speculation doesn't end up mattering, however, since the entire discussion that follows is just a standard philosophical argument against some philosophical theses and in favor of others. This same pattern is instantiated in Chapter 2's campaign against ontological and epistemic uses of simplicity. There's no attempt actually to show that proponents of evidential holism, or of ontological and epistemic conceptions of simplicity in science, lack sufficient evidence to convince anyone in their epistemic situation. I honestly can't imagine what such an attempt would look like. But I could probably speculate about it, since apparently almost anything qualifies as a speculation. That includes the "theory of everything," which Achinstein calls "the ultimate speculation." Here, once again, the reader finds himself wondering (a) whether it really makes sense to describe this as a speculation, and (b) whether the ensuing discussion is sufficiently illustrative of the history and philosophy of speculation to warrant an entire chapter in a book supposedly devoted to it.

Another general difficulty with the book stems from the heavy reliance on Achinstein's excellent previous work on evidence. The previous work itself is not the problem. The problem is that, because his account of speculation is defined partly in terms of evidence, Achinstein finds himself needing to appeal to philosophical conceptions of evidence quite a lot. This naturally leads him to draw on his own systematic and multi-dimensional account of evidence. However, the reader is never really given the chance to see how strong this account is, because all the support for it is contained in Achinstein's previous work. The effect is to leave the reader wondering more about the well-foundedness of Achinstein's previously developed technical machinery than it does about how well that machinery performs the tasks Achinstein set for it in this new book.

Aside from these major issues, there are a variety of midlevel failings that lie somewhere between serious problems and worthy quibbles. On the positive side, though, there is consistent attention throughout the book to the valuable pragmatic role that each of these "speculations" plays in the pursuit of scientific knowledge. Here the historical record is certainly on Achinstein's side, and it is interesting to watch as he looks for the distinctive pragmatic contribution of each different species of speculation. There is even a lengthy exercise in which he rereads Newton's "Rules of Reasoning in Philosophy" from a pragmatic point of view. One thing that emerges from this exercise is the significant gulf between realist and pragmatist approaches to understanding science in certain contexts, because more than one of these pragmatist reinterpretations seriously strains credulity (a point to which Achinstein seems sensitive).

As the philosophical study of scientific practice pushes ever further into the tangled and variegated understory that lies beneath the hallowed heights of theory, many of us have struggled to find unexplored territory that is (1) of general significance to the nature and growth of scientific knowledge, and (2) rich in philosophical potential. As Achinstein shows in yet another foundational contribution to the philosophy of science, speculation undeniably satisfies both criteria. However, as is often the case with foundational contributions, this book lacks structure and conceptual unity, and frequently leaves its most promising lines of inquiry undeveloped. Readers are far more likely to find philosophical insight in Achinstein's previous work.