Speculative Realism: An Introduction

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Graham Harman, Speculative Realism: An Introduction, Polity, 2018, 189pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781509519996.

Reviewed by Tom Sparrow, Slippery Rock University


Speculative Realism (SR) has been under discussion for the more than a decade now. Its origin story, often recounted in the books, articles, and blog posts written on the subject, traces SR back to a meeting of four philosophers at Goldsmiths, University of London on April 27, 2007. The present book begins by recapitulating, with firsthand detail, the story of how the Goldsmiths event came to fruition and what initially united the participants, Ray Brassier, Ian Hamilton Grant, Graham Harman, and Quentin Meillassoux. Harman, author of the book under review, sets out to account for the convergences and divergences that emerged at Goldsmiths. He provides a substantial overview of the four original strands of SR, not only as they manifested themselves in April 2007 but as they developed in the intervening years. Harman further attempts to discern the future direction of SR in its several variants, regardless of whether or not the thinker in question identifies with SR, as Harman does. On the whole, he offers a useful and characteristically readable introduction to SR, understood partly as a philosophical program unified against "correlationism" but much more as a field with multiple living variants. The book is filled with insights and details that only an insider can deliver, and in this respect it is a welcome addition to extant books aiming to introduce SR to those unfamiliar or only marginally familiar with the topic.

As an insider, of course, Harman faces a number of unusual challenges in his role as chronicler and critic. His readers, not to mention the subjects of his book, his SR compatriots, will worry about his fairmindedness or objectivity when presenting what are, by Harman's own admission, competing and inferior philosophical views. He addresses this worry on the first page and goes on to admit that, where criticism is concerned, the risk of distortion "is simply a normal occupational hazard of intellectual life" (2). This is no doubt true, so it is up to readers to judge Harman's objectivity for themselves. In my view, although his exposition occasionally veers abruptly into criticism, Harman's overall presentations of Brassier, Grant, and Meillassoux are serious, charitable, and engaged. At times I wonder if it may have been more accurate to call this book a "critical introduction" to SR. But insofar as it seems to target novices and students, it does not aspire to be the kind of critical introduction that assumes on the part of the readership a working knowledge of its subject matter. In a similar vein, the book could double as a sort of textbook, for undergraduate or graduate students, since it includes study questions at the close of each chapter section.

After a short introduction, the book presents alphabetically-ordered, substantial chapters on Brassier's "Prometheanism," Grant's "Vitalist Idealism," Harman's "Object-Oriented Ontology," and Meillassoux's "Speculative Materialism." Each of the four main chapters begins with a summary section recounting the remarks and arguments presented by the four original speculative realists at Goldsmiths. It should be noted that the full transcript for this event, including the Q&A portion, is available in the third volume of Collapse, published by Urbanomic in a limited run of 1000 copies in November 2007 and since reissued. The book concludes with some proposals for how the four major positions in SR can be aligned and categorized into subgroups. These proposals challenge a narrative about SR advanced by Slavoj Žižek in Less than Nothing, which I will return to momentarily.

The opening section of each chapter is followed by a critical outline of the views of the author in question as gleaned from the central texts published by that author. Each chapter concludes with a section, somewhat speculative, of where the author's current work is headed in the near future. Harman tends to approach all of this in a twofold way: on the one hand, he presents his four subjects (including himself) on their own terms, attempting to pinpoint their theoretical precursors and, on the other, to position their arguments in the contemporary scene. Whereas Grant, for example, draws deeply upon Schelling and other German idealists, and is actively engaged in current discussions of philosophical naturalism, Brassier is much more likely to contribute to debates in analytic philosophy of mind or philosophical nihilism, given his indebtedness to Wilfrid Sellars and his affinity with Thomas Metzinger. The overall effect of this chapter organization is that it provides both a short intellectual history and a philosophical assessment of Brassier, Grant, Harman, and Meillassoux. The nature of each philosopher's realism becomes clear, as does their broader contribution to the history of philosophy.

The book concludes with a brief retort to some critical remarks made by Žižek in his 2012 book Less Than Nothing. Among those remarks Žižek signals that SR is limited by the fact that, after the 2007 workshop at Goldsmiths, SR had splintered into several factions and lost whatever character as a unified movement it may have once had. Harman makes the opposite case, arguing that the splintering of SR is precisely a virtue, that "the diversity of positions was always the greatest strength of Speculative Realism" (166). He goes on to lament that the original initiators of SR, particularly Brassier, do not regard SR as a defined site of intellectual debate. The diversity of realisms that initially constituted SR, Harman confesses, "is the principal reason that I miss the days when the group still existed as a forum for friendly discussion" (166). Part of the virtue of the splintering of SR, Harman argues, is that it opens many doors for future, unforeseen variants of SR. If it is the case that philosophy is as much about spurring on conceptual innovation as it is about evaluating and advancing, then it is difficult to resist Harman's hope that his book will challenge its "younger readers . . . to supersede the various Speculative Realist currents after first digesting what has made them important" (169).

Readers already familiar with SR might be curious to know how Harman understands the movement's unity. As already noted, SR is generally regarded as unified in its opposition to the antirealist and anthropocentric stance that Meillassoux, in After Finitude, dubbed "correlationism." This is a relatively uncontentious point, unless one rejects the very existence of correlationism, as some still do (4). Additionally, however, SR is united in its willingness to engage in something that has been, generally speaking, prohibited by continental philosophy in recent decades: speculation. "All four [major positions in SR] are speculative, in the sense that, unlike the commonsensical realisms of yesteryear, all reach conclusions that seem counterintuitive or even downright strange" (5). This seems an almost trivial point, but it is one that needs to be made for those who insist that SR does not exist in any meaningful sense. While the degree and significance of SR's unity is a topic best left to the critical literature, it is important to know where Harman stands on the question.

The book does double duty by offering readers, in chapter 3, an explicit introduction to Harman's object-oriented ontology (OOO) as it has developed since the late 1990s, one that rivals any of his other introductions to his own philosophy. With more certainty than the chapters on Brassier, Grant, and Meillassoux, it indicates to readers the future direction of Harman's work. Taken as a whole, the book functions as a kind of negative introduction to OOO. Chapters 1, 2, and 4 mark numerous points of contrast between OOO and its rivals in the SR community. When Harman turns to Brassier's sharp attacks on Husserlian phenomenology, for instance, we learn just as much about what Harman finds salvageable in phenomenology, and its influence on OOO, as we do about Brassier's reductive naturalism (19). At times, readers aligned with Brassier or Grant or Meillassoux against OOO will take issue with Harman's critical tone. As someone sympathetic to Harman's brand of SR, I noted some instances where patience with one of his interlocutors was wearing thin and his distaste for the views or arguments under discussion became visible. Often, however, this distaste or impatience matches its target in tone and enlivens the prose with a hint of intellectual (if not emotional) investment.

Among the other books devoted to SR, Harman's is the only one that is devoted to introducing SR to the uninitiated and that attempts to give a comprehensive presentation of the four major orientations that emerged from the Goldsmiths workshop. Steven Shaviro's The Universe of Things: On Speculative Realism (2014) is more an original attempt at developing a Whitehead-inspired speculative realism than a proper introduction to the field and its several orientations. Peter Gratton's Speculative Realism: Problems and Prospects (2014) assumes a certain level of familiarity with its subject and reads more like a critical evaluation of SR's lasting impact than an introduction for beginners. My own The End of Phenomenology: Metaphysics and the New Realism (2014) is as much about phenomenology as it is about SR, so it is not exclusively an introduction to SR. Leon Niemoczynski's Speculative Realism: An Epitome (2017) purports to provide the conceptual underpinnings of SR while at the same time, confusingly, calling into question the very existence of SR. Oddly, Niemoczynski's book only discusses the work of Brassier, Grant, and Meillassoux. Harman's name and texts have been inexplicably excised from the book's pages, so it is difficult to see how it could possibly provide a comprehensive account of SR.

In any case, the book is a unique contribution to the growing literature on SR and will be a go-to text for anyone looking for an efficient and nuanced introduction to its subject, from undergraduate students to curious readers outside of academe.