Speculative Realism: Problems and Prospects

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Peter Gratton, Speculative Realism: Problems and Prospects, Bloomsbury, 2014, 266pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441174758.

Reviewed by Rick Dolphijn, Utrecht University


The Myth

Unheard of in philosophy, it began not with a whimper but a bang. In April 2007 Ray Brassier, Iain Hamilton Grant, Graham Harman and Quentin Meillassoux gave talks at a conference "Speculative Realism" at Goldsmiths, University of London. Although coming from very different traditions in philosophy, their compass points were all aimed at one central problem in European thinking: since Immanuel Kant, it had stopped being occupied with reality. In his Critique of Pure Reason, a difference between the noumenal (the world as it is "in-itself") and the phenomenal (the world as it appears to us) was introduced, and the claim of speculative realism is that since then this particular distinction, through various means, has continued to dominate philosophy. Unfortunately.

Of course this Kantian doctrine has been under attack many times, most profoundly (from a contemporary point of view) by Michel Foucault in The Order of Things (1966). This book, without a doubt a major influence on all the post-68 attempts to move the scope of philosophy from 'sameness' to 'otherness', famously analyzed the central position that Kantian thinking still gives to 'Man' and the 'I think'. According to Foucault, Kant turned philosophy into an anthropology of a very particular sort. We should be aware that this 'human' as we know it today, is only "a figure not yet two centuries old, a new wrinkle in our knowledge, [that] will disappear as soon as that knowledge has discovered a new form." (Foucault, xxiii) One could question whether Foucault, the historian, in the end succeeded in moving beyond Kant's anthropology (in 'discovering' this new form of man as he envisioned it). Michel Serres once stated: "An idea opposed to another idea is always the same idea, albeit affected by the negative sign. The more you oppose one another, the more you remain in the same framework of thought" (Serres with Latour 1995, 81). Perhaps we have to conclude that Foucault's focus on the socio-political histories of modernity continued to analyze the way the human histories of samenness and of otherness were given shape in recent European history, and that, although critiquing Kant, he stayed within the same framework. In line with his interests, Foucault's ("cultural-studies") followers in critical thinking (whether interested in race, gender or class) also were practicing a rethinking of our Kantian heritage in the social political realm.

At the start of the new millennium, the theoretical humanities in general, and continental philosophy in particular, welcomed quite a broad range of 'turns' such as new materialism, affect theory, process ontology and speculative realism. All of these developments can be considered post-Kantian, since all of them practice some sort of non-anthropocentrism, i.e.,, they all search for alternative frameworks of thought. Not critical or oppositional, but affirmative, these alternatives may traverse the division between the noumenal and the phenomenal (as with speculative realism), but actually all the dualisms have been installed under anthropocentric rule (between man and woman, human and animal, culture and nature, technology and nature, etc.), whether developed by Kant, Descartes, or phenomenology.

Of all of these 'turns', speculative realism is, perhaps, considered the most 'metaphysical'. It is not in the first place exploring alternative subject positions, as third wave materialist feminisms propose, and it is also not in the first place exploring alternative ecologies as in contemporary animal studies or naturalisms, though many of those contributing to speculative realism are equally interested in these (other) parts of contemporary theory. Speculative realism is known (rightfully or not) to insist on rethinking the Kantian opposition between the noumenal and the phenomenal. It insists on asking us: how come we can think reality but we cannot know it?

Peter Gratton's book aims at giving us an overview of what happened following the Speculative Realist 'bang' of 2007. The writings of the original members of this generation in philosophy were discussed, along with the second generation thinkers (yes things happen quickly) and others that, one way or another, work with similar frameworks of thought. In a brave (and well informed) attempt to broaden the scope of his analysis, Gratton not only analyzes the current state of this turn by rereading the history of continental philosophy (showing how its contributors offer us another Lacan, another Heidegger, another Hegel and even another Kant). He also searches for how the current discussion in our departments resonate with discussions in contemporary analytical philosophy (Michael Dummett, John Nolt), though I decided not to discuss that part of his work too much here for lack of space.

In the introduction, Gratton, with a good sense of relativism and 'an earthly wit', proves himself fully aware of all the dangers of writing books 'on the latest turns and beyond'. After setting out the promises and pitfalls of these projects (stating "Am I not giving into this whole cynical viewpoint here with this book? A few years and we have a 'movement?' Is someone, somewhere negotiating the merchandising rights, too?" (2), Gratton notes that even some of the original members, e.g.,Brassier, conclude that the speculative realist movement "exists only in the imaginations of a group of bloggers promoting an agenda for which I have no sympathy whatsoever". Taking Brassier's allegations very seriously, Gratton concludes, however: "An early book on it should investigate just what is being sold to the 'impressionable' and incredulous alike" (3). He immediately adds that rethinking the noumenal/phenomenal distinction forms the starting point of his analysis. He labels this rethinking 'correlationism', and adds that it is Harman's way of claiming the common ground of speculative thinking (6). Correlationism, as a word, is distilled directly from the work of Kant who talks of it as follows: "What we call external objects are nothing but mere presentations of our sensibility . . . its true correlate, i.e., the thing in itself, is not cognized at all through these presentations and cannot be." (CoPR: B45/A30, italics are mine)

If correlationism is the theme, however, then let us be very clear about its development. For as much as Harman reads this (rightly or wrongly) throughout the work of a series of contemporary philosophers, it is first and foremost the Kantian critique of Quentin Meillassoux (in his After Finitude) that forms the basis for speculative realism and for this study. Meillassoux considers correlationism (the real Kantian "Copernican Revolution") to be the greatest horror of contemporary philosophy, and in much stronger words than Foucault (and his followers), it is this concept that allows Meillassoux to expose the anthropocentrism in contemporary thinking. Its starting point, the idea that we can only get access to a thing through how it appears to us (according to the possibilities of the human mind) seems to him completely absurd (and dangerous!).

Gratton discusses Meillassoux's 'critique of Critique', as Alain Badiou called it (Meillassoux, VII) in the introduction and in Chapter One. In Chapter Two, he attacks the idea that "correlationism consists in disqualifying the claim that it is possible to consider the realms of subjectivity and objectivity independently of one another" (Meillassoux, 5). Stressing the power of science, Meillassoux cites the "ancestral statements" that scientists make (e.g., scientists have no problem concluding to the existence of a fossil, its 'reality' or 'event', that they have never seen alive and that even lived before humanity as such (so before the phenomenal existed)). For the true correlationist this should be impossible. As Gratton puts it, "Correlationists, thus, end up reducing everything, including the ancestral, to its appearance to conscious beings, yet the ancestral is precisely that which is not given to any consciousness or language" (44). No doubt 'the bang' of speculative realism, for at least many theorists (including Gratton we can assume), comes from the power of this statement. It tells us that, although we've all read (and understood) Foucault's critique on Kant, we still are Kantians in every way, we still think it is impossible to take human thought out of the equation.

But how does Meillassoux continue from here? Gratton seems to be rather disappointed in what follows the correlationist grand statement. Reading After Finitude closely, Gratton notices Meillassoux's firm belief in the power of mathematics (set theory, as inherited from Alain Badiou) and physics (as the mediator or the basis of all truths). This still remains a thesis on the scope of formal languages and is not 'operationalized' in his work. Following the idea that everything that is "mathematizable is absolutizable" (79), Meillassoux concludes that the Absolute has been excluded from philosophy's language since Kant. This has left a gap for the relativists and the faithful (unrestricted by philosophy, they eagerly talk of God and his powers). Gratton: "One can ask whether or not this is Meillassoux's strongest claim" (45).

Gratton seems to be in doubt when it comes to the practical realization of Meillassoux's critique of Critique; and although he refuses to set aside the idea (from Harman) that anti-correlationism is what moves Speculative realism, he permits himself to search for an alternative force that drives speculative realist thought. He proposes to map the alternative theories of time, or better the reality of time, that one can find throughout speculative realist thinking. Starting from the ancestral statement of Meillassoux, and the idea that his ultimate real equals pure chaos ("the only 'eternal principle' is the factuality of contingency" (59-60)), Gratton develops this alterative common ground in his readings of the realisms to come. The key is of course the idea that, contrary to (strong) correlationists such as Merleau-Ponty, time is not born of my relation to things (see 28). The radical openness that speculative realism is interested in, the quest for the conditions of possibility as they can be found in "the Great Outdoors" (i.e., beyond any Subjectivity), has to be driven by another form of time.

The Variations (upon the Variations)

After the long and meticulous analysis of Meillassoux (which takes up almost half the book (the Introduction, Chapters One through Three)), the five chapters that follow focus initially on the three other original members of the 2007 Goldsmith conference. Harman, whose sharp pen comments upon many of the issues discussed in the book, and the Object-Oriented Ontology he proposes, comes first. With a strong background in Heideggerian phenomenology (with which he shares his suspicion towards materialism (or onto-theology)), combined with how Bruno Latour (inspired by the (bio)sciences) "restore[s] the flat ontology that treats humans no differently from candles, armies and stars" (93), Harman conceptualizes 'the object' in a remarkable and thought provoking way. Accepting Meillassoux's critique on correlationism means for Harman a radical departure from any form of subjectivity and a return to a fascination for what specific objects (or specific (non-subjectivist) manifestations, which he considers 'the same thing') can do. Or, in his own words: "a thing is real beyond its conditions of accessibility" (91). Together with Tim Morton (ecology) and Ian Bogost (new media studies), he considers the transcendental ego to be without content, a claim that surely raised some eyebrows in many parts of contemporary philosophy. Nevertheless, one wonders whether this is not merely a way to be radically open to the power of the object/the manifestation. Harman's critique of Meillassoux's claims about the dignity of the human as some sort of necessity shows that he is more radical in his anti-Kantianism than Meillassoux, who in the end remains a dualist.

In the next chapter, the naturalism of Grant, where nature is the starting point of the analysis, is discussed along with the neo-Darwinism of Elizabeth Grosz and the materialism of Jane Bennett. Though Grant is concerned mainly with Shelling's naturalism and its speculative nature, he is sympathetic to post-kantianism, as are Harman and Meillassoux. He emphasizes the 'ungrounding powers' that perform a dynamism that cannot be thought since thought is only a product of this dynamism. Thus he asks us to "understand nature as always more subject than object, the ground and condition of human subjectivity rather than simply the object of human reflection" (112). Although Grant therefore fits the speculative realist frame, the other scholars discussed here (Bennett and especially Grosz), who do share some aspects of his naturalism (I can imagine them somewhat sympathetic to Grant's theory of 'grounding'), cannot easily be linked to the correlationist common ground central to this book. It would be interesting to see in what way Grosz's elaborate writings on time would fit Gratton's alternative trail (speculative realism as a theory of time), as announced at the start of the book, but unfortunately (and surprisingly) this is not developed here.

Gratton does point out something very important with respect to Grant, Bennett and Grosz (and perhaps those who come after them): "It's somewhat a scandal that Spinoza is positively misunderstood by the majority of philosophers" (111). Especially when reading the posthumanism of Grosz, Bennett and Malabou, it definitely makes more sense to use a Spinozist lens than a Meillassouxian one to situate their work. Instead of Meillassoux, Harman, Grant and Brassier, their ideas can be read much better in relation to the materialist works of Rosi Braidotti, Donna Haraway and Karen Barad, and the way they reread Deleuze, Bergson and of course Spinoza. To add another (minor) critical note: it is no coincidence that all three of these contemporary post-Kantian thinkers are women, in fact, that these are the only women given serious attention in the book. This isn't the place to discuss the point at length, but it is telling that this particularly (metaphysical) branch of contemporary thinking, which is not keen on situating itself in political and ethical debates, is practiced (primarily) by (white) middle-aged men . . .

Brassier's nihilism, discussed in the next chapter, does bring us back to correlationism and Meillassoux's critique of Kant/praise for science, as it also wants to attack the humanism (or rather the fear for nihilism) which he considers to be an Enlightenment residue. Supporting Meillassoux's factuality of contingency (as discussed above), nihilism, for Brassier, is a search for the radical openness that so many of the speculative realists emphasize. Nihilism is a speculative opportunity, as Brassier also reads this in the work of François Laruelle and Wilfrid Sellars (making Brassier actually the only philosopher discussed for whom the combined continental and analytic approach makes sense (unfortunately)). The final two chapters are on Adrian Johnston (rereading Lacan) and Malabou (rereading Hegel), who like Bennett and Grosz, are much more practicing materialists, and seem much more interested in the current state of the sciences. The work of Malabou especially, as I noted earlier, seems to long for a Spinozist lens instead of Meillassouxian one, as it again is much more materialist, monist, situated and activist, compared to speculative realism.

Time Regained

In the conclusion, Gratton fully develops the theory of time he prefers to read as the backbone of speculative realism. Much less critical than correlationism, which, although a shock to thought, in a way also limits us to the Kantian framework (paraphrasing Serres), the search for the reality of time allows us to speculate on contemporary metaphysical questions in a much more open way. It also allows us to stress that the questions that speculative realism is interested in are not Kantian or modern even but are "timely"; they revitalize age old theorems of philosophy while opening up a speculative realist future. And thus Gratton proposes a rewriting of rewriting philosophy keeping the dangers of correlationism in the back of our heads: "The difficulty of taking time as real is no doubt also made difficult because much work on Heidegger, Derrida, Deleuze, et.al, tended to think time in terms of the time of life and less about the reality of time- in short as correlationist" (204). Seemingly echoing Meillassoux (and his critique of Deleuze's life (Meillassoux, 37)), Gratton critiques the interpretations of Heidegger, Derrida and Deleuze, rather than the original work. And although it is an 'easy critique' (probably referring to cultural-studies readings of these thinkers), the call for conceptual clarity is of course valid. Deleuze's theories on time, for instance, have been read as if they unfold in 'my relation with things', to paraphrase Merleau-Ponty, whereas Deleuze's long analysis of Chronos and Aion, the materialisms of Zeus and Saturn and the pure power of Hercules, are by no means in need of an anthropos.

Keeping in mind the search for a radical openness characteristic of all speculative realists (from Meillassoux's factuality of contingency to Brassier's nihilism unbound), Gratton is struck by how the later Derrida is interested in an ethics and a politics of the future. As he says, "for Derrida, the structure of the future is that which we must welcome without delay, since of course, this is temporalization itself. This would be a future that would be wholly other, not the future as thought from the present" (213). Of course this 'radical emancipation' of the future, echoing Levinas, is projected back into the present, as it differentiates (meaning to temporize, to take recourse in) the present: "This … means also that there is no present in which the Other is, and thus the Other comes to me from a future that transcends our epistemologies of the present but is nevertheless real" (216). Thus, finally, saying, "This time would not be correlationist, since . . . it cannot be made present to thought" (216), Gratton offers us an apt conclusion of his thorough analysis of the speculative realist present and the unforeseen future to come.


Michel Foucault [1966/1970] 1994. The Order of Things: An Archaeology of the Human Sciences. Vintage.

Immanuel Kant [1781, 1787] 1998. Critique of Pure Reason. Second edition. P. Guyer and A. W. Wood (trs.). Cambridge University Press.

Quentin Meillassoux (2008 [2006]) After Finitude. Ray Brassier (tr). Continuum.

Michel Serres with Bruno Latour. 1995. "Third Conversation: Demonstration and Interpretation," in Conversations on Science, Culture, and Time, 77-123. The University of Michigan Press.