Speech Matters: On Lying, Morality, and the Law

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Seana Valentine Shiffrin, Speech Matters: On Lying, Morality, and the Law, Princeton University Press, 2014, 234pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781400852529.

Reviewed by Robert Mark Simpson, University of Chicago/Monash University


The words 'communication' and 'community' are etymologically descended from Latin terms that refer to the notion of things being shared or held in common. And there's surely something to be said -- in view of that etymological relation, but also for other reasons -- in favor of an understanding of these two concepts that emphasizes their connection to one another. Community might be conceived of as a state of human affairs defined by the establishment or maintenance of reliable channels of interpersonal communication. Communication might be understood, in turn, as encompassing forms of idea-transmission that express or conduce to communal relations with others. One consequence of endorsing these kinds of conceptual links is that we'll be unable to say much about the ethics or politics of communication without first thinking hard about how our speech affects (and effects) our community. Claims about what we should and shouldn't say, and about what are appropriate reactions to communication (one's own, or others), will to at least some degree hinge on our views about what constitutes a good and/or just 'common life'.

Seana Valentine Shiffrin's book and its six chapters (which can be read together, or as standalone essays) seek to illuminate a range of subtle but significant conceptual connections between communication and community, in order to help us better apprehend the ways in which -- and the reasons why -- 'speech matters'. The normative force of 'matters', for Shiffrin's purposes, is both ethical and political. The first two chapters are more naturally read as inquiries in ethical theory, whereas the latter chapters would probably be filed under political or legal philosophy. Although, having said that, it's one of the merits of her analysis that it complicates these sub-disciplinary distinctions.

In chapter one Shiffrin examines the distinctive wrong of lying, which, on her account, owes not to the fact that lies characteristically deceive, but to the fact that they misuse or subvert the processes through which we reliably convey information to each other, thus undermining the integrity of those processes, and jeopardizing the further ends -- including certain compulsory moral ends -- that rely upon them. The question, given that analysis, is when and why our interactions sometimes shift over into a 'justified suspended context', i.e., a context in which "there is a normatively justified reason for the suspension of the presumption of truthfulness" (17). Surely there's nothing wrong with speaking untruthfully to the murderer at the door about the target's whereabouts? Shiffrin wants to endorse the commonsense verdict -- that if I know the target's location, I may speak untruthfully in these circumstances -- while also placing limits on the kinds of untruths that may be conveyed under dire conditions more generally. To pass on my knowledge of the target's location would be to cooperate in a heinous crime, and thus it's permissible to convey a falsehood regarding that matter. But according to Shiffrin, this doesn't mean that I'm permitted to volunteer an elaborate deceptive fiction, or to use actorly skills to trick the murderer into thinking that I'm trying to help him while covertly working against him. Even when facing the murderer at the door, she argues, we must refrain from forms of untruthfulness that strategically subvert the machinery of authentic communicative interaction with others, because, she says, such misrepresentations damage that machinery, and excommunicate their recipients from the moral community.

In chapter two Shiffrin examines the nature of promises made under duress. If the promisor's commitments to the promisee are extracted via coercion, then the promisee isn't wronged if the promisor later reneges. But that cannot be the whole story about the status of coerced promises, Shiffrin says, because promises are about more than just who can legitimately demand what from whom. Even under conditions of duress, we need the ability to make binding promises, she argues, so that we can make commitments that "generate opportunities and occasions for moral progress" (60), where moral progress may involve a settling of the (duress-involving) conflict, or maybe just the establishment of a thin foundation of trust on the basis of which we might start rebuilding healthy communal relations. It's not meant to follow from this that the law should recognize agreements made under duress as binding; this would, Shiffrin suggests, "throw the weight of the community behind the aims of the coercer" (70). Rather, by recognizing (at least some) promises made under duress as binding, we preserve a means via which the coercer's aims may be countered, insofar as he is -- as the addressee of a binding promise -- being called back into the relations of mutual esteem and concern, which he has abandoned in inflicting coercive duress upon the promisor in the first place.

In chapter three Shiffrin argues that the interests served by ethical prohibitions on lying are among the central interests furthered by legal structures that preserve a special arena of liberty in thought and communication. This claim underwrites what she calls a 'thinker-based approach' to free speech, according to which the scope, extent, and structure of the special communicative liberties enshrined in our legal institutions are meant to be guided by the question of what conditions are needed to accommodate the meaningful exercise of our capacities qua thinking beings. Her account bears notable similarities to Mill's arguments for free speech in On Liberty, in that she sees very little conceptual space between the ability to speak one's mind and the possibility of having a mind of one's own in the first place. Conditions in the censorious regime are likened to solitary incarceration, the suggestion being that one only really thinks one's thoughts in the sharing of them with others. In this and other ways, the links between communication and community come to the fore again. A thinker-based theory of free speech emphasizes "externalizing mental content and interacting with other thinkers as a method of developing one's mental capacities" (104), and thus it enjoins strong protections for voluntary associations, and robust communicative liberties for children, both of which are novel and distinctive points of emphasis within a free speech theory.

In chapters four and five Shiffrin discusses the legal regulation of lies, arguing that restrictions on lying are not inherently at odds with a proper commitment to free speech. While there are pragmatic reasons (e.g., concerning governmental abuse) to be wary about any particular policy that legally restricts lying, there is no intrinsic free-speech-based reason to oppose such policies. Deliberately untrue assertions, even in the absence of actual deception or intention to deceive, are in principle and in at least some cases liable to legal regulation. Shiffrin considers various counterarguments to this claim -- that the regulation of lies involves content-discrimination, that lies are insufficiently harmful to warrant restriction, and that lies sometimes partake of free speech values -- and finds them all wanting. At the same time, though, she acknowledges that there are good independent reasons, beyond worries about the possibility of government overreach, for societies to refrain from any kind of regulation of 'pure autobiographical lies', i.e., the relatively low-stakes untruths that beings like us routinely convey in an attempt to make ourselves seem slightly better or more interesting than we really are. The legal toleration of such untruths is "a form of recognition and acceptance of some degree of weakness on the part of our fellow citizens" (167), and this kind of accommodation has a particular symbolic value, on Shiffrin's account, insofar as it betokens a kind of egalitarian and inclusive willingness, on all of our parts, to accept each other as we are, with our insecurities in tow.

Chapter six offers some novel comments on the role of the university in society, on how academic freedom ought to be understood in light of that role, and on the limits of justified untruthfulness within the university and other public institutions. Most interesting is Shiffrin's suggestion that much of the lying and misrepresentation that's involved in psychological research is in tension with the university's role in society as an embodiment of our proper social-epistemic aspirations. To regard the psychological experiment as the sort of justified suspended context that licenses untruthful representations, Shiffrin argues, "would dilute the symbolic strength of our perceived commitments to the social, noninstrumental importance of knowledge and the preservation of reliable and free mechanisms for its transmission" (223).

One thing that's not entirely clear in the chapters on free speech is how other putative reasons for respecting special communicative liberties -- like the reasons adverted to in democracy-based arguments for free speech, or in epistemic arguments for free speech -- are involved in Shiffrin's thinker-based approach, and how (if at all) restrictions on communicative liberty under her theory are supposed to be sensitive to the force of these other considerations. On one hand, she allows that "some degree of eclecticism is inevitable," and that "other values will bear on how particular cases or areas of free speech doctrine should be resolved" (85-86). But at the same time, she wants to say that the concerns adverted to by a thinker-based approach -- e.g., about the conditions necessary to cultivate people's capacities as autonomous thinkers -- are meant to establish priorities and impose a structural framework on our free speech theorizing. This may be fine, so far as the aim is to provide an abstract theory about what it is that weaves together the disconnected strands of the free speech tradition, and about where the ultimate normative force resides for the different arguments we find in that tradition. But the chapters on the legal regulation of lies suggest that Shiffrin's thinker-based approach is not intended to serve merely as a philosophical backstory for the more familiar arguments -- democratic, epistemic, and expressive -- that we find in free speech discourse. Rather, we're supposed to be able to make practice-level judgments about the legitimacy of particular free-speech-related policies (e.g., policies regulating certain kinds of lies) by asking how those policies express or respond to the concerns that are prioritized under a thinker-based approach. In other words, a thinker-based approach is not just meant to undergird a standard view of free speech as an apparatus for protecting (and/or promoting) democratic or epistemic or expressive values; instead, it's supposed to refashion and potentially disrupt that view.

If that's right, then a thinker-based approach to free speech might propel us towards a radically different set of policies and practices than we see in orthodox views of free speech. If there are good reasons to think that the development of intellectual autonomy in some people is impaired by, say, dogmatic religious education, or by a systematically misogynistic visual culture, or by the promulgation of reactionary paranoia on the internet, then we seemingly have pro tanto good reasons to regulate or suppress all those things in the name of free speech. Perhaps that's where Shiffrin thinks free speech theory needs to go; perhaps, like some other critics of free speech orthodoxy,[1] she thinks that securing conditions that promote the development of people's autonomous capacities is likely to require balancing limitations on communicative liberty, rather than a far-reaching immunization of communicative conduct from government interference. These kinds of radical reformatory possibilities would become somewhat more remote, however, if Shiffrin were to allow that democratic and epistemic concerns (for instance) can supply some significant part of the normative force in her free speech theory. So, clarifying how thinker-based concerns interact with other parts of free speech discourse is not just a matter of filling out the abstract details of the account; it's also essential to determining the practical implications of the thinker-based approach to free speech that Shiffrin is endorsing.

A more abstract worry with Shiffrin's discussion, particularly in the early chapters on lying and promises, is the way she tends to characterize insincerity and promissory infidelity as not merely transgressions against community values, but rather things that fundamentally jeopardize communal relations. In discussing the distinctive wrong of lying, for instance, she says "We must preserve an exit through which we could negotiate an end to conflict and move toward reconciliation using rational discourse rather than relying solely upon the crude tools of violence, domination, and extermination" (25). What I find odd about this, and other remarks Shiffrin makes, is not just the suggestion that lying can drag the community down from a state of (relative) innocence into the mires of treachery and conflict, but that lying can be responsible for effecting this kind of shift in a world that's already populated by the figures in her key examples, namely, thieving muggers and murderers at the door. Shiffrin offers many rich insights into the subtle ways that lies and promissory infidelity -- even in those cases where exigent circumstances seem to warrant them -- nevertheless 'cut against' our ideals of community. But why not think that what follows is just that we have defeasible, pro tanto reasons not to manipulate murderers or trick muggers, reasons that can be overridden in emergencies? Her worry, on this front, is that if we misuse or subvert tools of authentic communication, so as to avoid calamity in an emergency, we thereby salt the earth in which the seeds of mutual concern and respect are to be planted. But this strikes me as a misleadingly all-or-nothing way of thinking about how communal relations are to be established and fostered. If it's possible for us to rebuild communal relations with perpetrators of violence, as Shiffrin's whole analysis (rightly) maintains, then surely it's also possible to rebuild communal relations with perpetrators of subversive manipulation and deceitful chicanery. Failures of sincerity and promissory fidelity may make these rebuilding processes more difficult, granted, but it's difficult to see how they transcendentally thwart them. More generally, communicative integrity may well be of vital importance in cultivating a thriving community, and Shiffrin's analysis helps us to see the contours of this relationship more clearly. At times, though, she seems to be encouraging us to regard the common life as something that's fatally imperiled by failures of communicative integrity, and that's at least in tension with the experience most of us have, of being in authentic communion with others despite their failures of communicative integrity, and our own.

[1] E.g., Susan J. Brison (1998), "The autonomy defense of free speech", Ethics 108 (2): 312-39.