Spinoza and the Case for Philosophy

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Elhanan Yakira, Spinoza and the Case for Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 283pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107069985.

Reviewed by Alexander Douglas, Heythrop College, University of London


A few decades ago, studies of Spinoza’s philosophy in the English-speaking world were disproportionately focused on metaphysical issues, especially on Spinoza’s intriguing but elusive approach to the mind-body problem. Michael Della Rocca’s Representation and the Mind-Body Problem in Spinoza (1996) gives a good sense of the scholarly agenda during that period. More recently, scholarly attention has broadened to include interest in Spinoza’s theories concerning the relation of philosophy to religion; Susan James’ Spinoza on Philosophy, Religion, and Politics (2012) is an exemplary case.

Elhanan Yakira promises to link together these scholarly interests. A main thesis of his book is that Spinoza approaches ‘the question of religion’ by way of his ‘very particular mind-body doctrine’ (49).

After a preliminary section questioning the religious character of Spinoza’s thinking, Chapter Two begins the examination of Spinoza’s mind-body doctrine. Yakira’s first task is to reject the ‘parallelist’ interpretation, according to which Spinoza’s mind-body doctrine is to be understood in terms of an isomorphism between private inner experiences and public events in an observable physical world (this is not quite how Yakira expresses the view, but I find his terms loose and difficult to follow). It is not clear who is supposed to have advanced this interpretation, but Yakira rightly objects that it fails to do justice to Spinoza’s central claim that the mind (or soul) is the idea of the body. I agree with the objection, though the most compelling reason behind it is one that Yakira does not explicitly give: the relation between an idea and its object is clearly asymmetrical — an idea is not the object of its object — whereas the relation of isomorphism is symmetrical — a thing is isomorphic to its isomorph.

In Chapters Three and Four, Yakira presents his alternative reading of Spinoza’s mind-body doctrine, culminating in the assertion that: ‘the soul is what it feels like to be a body. Better still, it is what it thinks like to be a body; or, in fact, the soul is what it means to be a body’ (163). I found Yakira’s explanation of this doctrine to be extremely opaque. The best I can do is to explain what I think he might mean.

The proposition of Spinoza’s that most interests Yakira is 2p13 — ‘the object of the idea constituting the human mind is the human body’, later glossed as ‘the soul is the idea of the body’ (2p15d). Yakira insists that this should not be seen as a referring to a relation of representation or intentionality: for Spinoza ‘The soul, as the idea of the body, is not about the body’ (162). He means, I think, that the relation Spinoza supposes to hold between soul and body is more akin to that between a word and its meaning than that between an object and a picture of that object. The relation between object and picture is an external relation: we can still have the picture even if the object is destroyed and vice-versa. By contrast, the relation between the word and its meaning is internal: if it didn’t have that meaning, it wouldn’t be that word. Likewise, in claiming that the soul is the idea of the body, Spinoza is not saying that the soul is a mental representation of the body; rather, it stands to the body as a meaning stands to a word.

Yakira’s explanation proposes that ‘Body and soul are one as a circle and its idea or a pendulum and its equation are one’ (158). The pendulum-equation pair is the more illuminating of these. The relation between the pendulum and the equation describing its motion is, again, internal: if the pendulum’s motion were not described by that equation then it would be not be that motion. For any motion there is an equation that perfectly describes it, and the soul stands to the body as the equation to the motion. The soul as the idea of the body is thus an idea in something like the sense of Frege’s ‘Thought’: not a subjective event in the inner life of a subject but rather the abstract object that forms the (non-subjective) content of a statement. The difference is that for Yakira’s Spinoza there is no statement bearing the content; instead, the body itself plays this role. Thus I interpret Yakira’s claim that ‘the soul is what it means to be a body’ as meaning something like: the soul is the meaning of the body, in the same sense that a Fregean Thought is the meaning of a statement. Naturally the metaphor only works if we take a naïvely objectivist view of meaning: a statement simply carries its meaning, there is no society of language-users establishing the meaning by common interpretative practice.

How, if this is right, can Spinoza account for error? If the soul is not a representation of the body but rather its meaning, then there seems to be no room for error. A representation can misrepresent its object, but the meaning of a statement (or in this case a body) just is what it is. I can be wrong about what ‘snow is white’ means, but it is bare nonsense to say that the meaning of ‘snow is white’ is itself incorrect. Likewise I can be wrong about which geometrical shape a pendulum’s motion describes, but again it is bare nonsense to say that the shape that the motion describes is itself incorrect. So how can Spinoza account for erroneous ideas?

Yakira turns to this question in Chapter Six. Most interestingly, he draws upon a relatively forgotten article by H.F. Hallett (‘On a Reputed Equivoque in the Philosophy of Spinoza’, 1949). Hallett ascribes to Spinoza a sort of Whiteheadian cosmology, according to which every body intrinsically represents the larger physical system in which it is integrated. Each body is affected by other bodies and carries the traces of all other bodies as a photographic plate carries traces of those objects by receiving light rays refracted off the objects to which it is exposed. Spinoza seems to express something like this idea, specifically with regard to the human body, at 2p16. But just as a photograph can be imperfect — images cast on the photographic plate can be poor or fair representations of the objects that cast them — so the human body can be an imperfect representation of the physical system in which it is integrated — the affections of the human body can adequately or inadequately ‘express the natures’ of the objects that affected it.

Of course a photograph is neither accurate nor inaccurate unless it is interpreted according to some scheme. But the body, on this reading of Spinoza, possesses its meaning objectively; as a representation of its world it carries what some philosophers call ‘underived intentionality’. To continue the metaphor from above, imagine a set of statements describing a park that carry their meaning objectively rather than relative to some set of linguistic practices. The relation of the statements to their meaning is perfect and internal. It is by way of this meaning that they can function as a description of the park. But the accuracy of the description is a matter of the relation between the statements and the park. The meaning plays only a mediating role: get the statements right and they will describe the park; meaning will take care of itself. The body, for Spinoza, is a ‘statement’ describing a world; the soul is the meaning of the statement; error is a matter of the statement’s not being adequate to the world it describes. This is an obscure doctrine in many ways, but it does seem to be Spinoza’s.

Yakira (if I interpret him rightly) uses this insight into Spinoza’s doctrine to show how Spinoza reframes philosophical questions about realism and consciousness. The question of realism is shifted from its traditional position, as a question about the relation of ideas to their objects, to a newly corporeal plane. The question of realism concerns how adequately the human body represents its corporeal environment. Ideas play only the mediating role of meaning: it is by way of the soul — the meaning of the body — that the body represents its world. It is bodies, not ideas, that represent other bodies, though they do so by way of their ideas, just as words represent objects by way of their meanings. The question of realism is one of whether bodies correspond to their represented objects, not of whether ideas do so.

The question of consciousness is similarly reframed. Typically, the mystery of consciousness is framed as a question of how a concrete physical particular — the human body, or some privileged part of it — can give rise to a concrete mental particular — the conscious experience of a subject. For Spinoza this question does not arise because the soul is not a concrete mental particular. Again, it is an abstract universal on the order of the geometrical shape described by a motion or a Fregean Thought. This, at least, is the most sense I can make of this statement:

that our body has an “idea” — a theoretical description or, by generalizing and abstracting, a theoretical concept or, if one prefers, an equation — does not seem to demand the same kind of explanation the philosophers of consciousness feel they have to give to the experience of “being conscious.” (174)

In Chapter Seven, Yakira returns to the question of the religious character of Spinoza’s philosophy, discussing ideas about the eternity of the soul, the nature of perfection, the ‘third kind of knowledge’, and value. Yakira traces Spinoza’s arguments to show that philosophical understanding is the source of true freedom and salvation. But, Yakira notes, since this understanding is an affair of the mind, and since Spinoza regards the mind as the idea of the body, true freedom and salvation must be ultimately concerned with the body. Since the relation between mind and body is internal in the same sense as the relation between a statement and its meaning, having a certain sort of mind — the kind endowed with philosophical understanding — must mean having a certain sort of body. One of the last sentences in the book is:

Salvation, beatitude, and freedom is the philosophical understanding, knowledge, or intellecting of the body; or, to say it in a somewhat less dramatic way, it is the foundation of everything that is valuable, truthful, and important and where everything that is valuable, truthful, and important leads. (268)

This does appear to follow from Spinoza’s doctrine. But Yakira suggests that the reader might find it paradoxical — ’Isn’t it all just one big oxymoron?’ This is because traditionally salvation and beatitude are held to transcend concerns with one’s life as a particular embodied being at a particular time and place. But this point might be oversold. As Hallett notes, Spinoza seems to think that the body is itself a representation of the rest of the universe. Understanding the body is thus understanding, at least indirectly, the rest of the universe. And Spinoza claims that the idea of each body ‘involves the eternal and infinite essence of God’ (2p45), so the understanding of the body quite clearly transcends concern with local and transient things.

There is a great deal in this book that I have not mentioned, from a very interesting historical discussion of the notion of genetic definitions to an appraisal of the relations between Spinoza’s philosophy and the phenomenological tradition. I was particularly interested in a section on ‘the logic of involving’ (111-6); no doubt other readers will find sections that speak to their own peculiar interests. Here I have been concerned only to extract the main line of argument from the text, and even this has been, as I admitted above, a speculative exercise.

The book is extremely difficult to read. The structure is very loose, with rapid and extreme switches of topic. There are few signposts to guide the reader. Certain points are made clearly; others are expressed gnomically; many of the book’s statements I couldn’t make any sense of at all. Yakira notes in the Preface how an anonymous reviewer for CUP suspected that the book was ‘written in an overly emphasized “French scholarly idiom”’(x). Yakira reports having then tried to translate the work into ‘an English idiom’. Perhaps as a result, the style is bizarrely inconsistent; it lurches between dry, academic prose and flourishes of Heideggerian rhetoric (‘Thought is an infinite, and primordial possibility of being’ (101)). For me the problem is neither of excessive ‘emphasis’ (whatever that means) nor of national idiom but simply of clarity and consistency. The lack of a clear overall structure and this remaining awkwardness about idiom give the book the appearance of still being in draft form. There are fascinating pieces of analysis and disaggregated components of a compelling thesis, but the reader will have to decide whether it is worth the effort to dig them out.