Spinoza and the Specters of Modernity: The Hidden Enlightenment of Diversity from Spinoza to Freud

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Michael Mack, Spinoza and the Specters of Modernity: The Hidden Enlightenment of Diversity from Spinoza to Freud, Continuum, 2010, 222pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441118721.

Reviewed by Omri Boehm, New School for Social Research/ LMU-Munich


In the last ten years or so, the question of Spinoza's impact on Enlightenment thought has been opened anew. The thinker who up until recently was deemed "hardly to have had any direct influence on eighteenth-century thought" (Ernst Cassirer, The Philosophy of the Enlightenment, 187) is now being read as a major contributor -- perhaps the major contributor -- to Enlightenment thinking and politics. Jonathan Israel's Radical Enlightenment marks the founding moment of this trend -- a trend motivated not only by a historical interest, to uncover Spinoza's far-underestimated impact on the Enlightenment, but also by a normative project: to revive Enlightenment values -- the true ones, of 'radical', secular, anti-colonial modernity.

Michael Mack's Spinoza and the Specters of Modernity certainly belongs to this trend, extending it to the study of Herder (this is the book's core), Goethe, George Eliot and Freud. Herder's Spinozist radical Enlightenment is presented as an answer to the Enlightenment of Kant which is infected, on that reading, with an unwelcome baggage of Christian dualism, faith in teleology and even racism. I believe that there is little room for doubt that Spinoza's impact on Enlightenment thought indeed deserves the growing attention it now receives. But the belief that a remedy for modernity's malaise can be found in more Spinozism (and less Kantianism) seems to me questionable. I will review Mack's new contribution from that perspective.

The systematic question guiding Mack's project is the (often doubted) compatibility of Enlightenment universalism with the modern commitment to the value of diversity. Universalism is commonly judged as a symptom (or even the origin) of colonial European chauvinism. But by treating a non-exclusivist thinker like Herder as a true heir of the Enlightenment -- rather than as an anti-Enlightenment figure, as he will be remembered from Isaiah Berlin or more recently from Zeev Sternhell's The Anti-Enlightenment Tradition -- Mack challenges this common judgment.

The book's first two chapters are dedicated to Spinoza, whose philosophical position is presented as a conceptual framework enjoining universalism with diversity. Spinoza achieves this by undermining teleology, "absolutist epistemology," anthropomorphism and, in general, any sort of dualism (see esp. 15-29). Spinoza's critique flattens all hierarchical thinking -- a type of thinking that Mack considers a "tyranny of universal ideas" (42). In Spinoza's mechanistic, non-hierarchical framework no subjective goals can be viewed as superior to others, mind can't be viewed as superior to body, no subjective way of thinking can be identified with the grand natural plan, and no single epistemology -- so Mack claims -- can be taken to reveal the truth of 'God or nature'.

The second cluster of chapters consists in an interpretation of Herder as an heir of Spinoza. Herder "criticized types of thinking that confused the logical with the existential or the real and thereby superimposed the former onto the latter" (48). Herder's critique is reminiscent, on that reading, of the Spinozist critique of absolutist epistemology -- an epistemology leading to the "logical fallacy of culture." According to Mack, that fallacy consists in identifying one's own perspective as a center from which the true natural order can be described. He ascribes that fallacy first and foremost to Herder's philosophy teacher, Kant, whose anthropomorphic position Herder criticized. With Spinoza and against Kant, we are told, Herder insisted that "All so called pure thinking into the deity is deception and game, the worst mysticism, which only fails to recognize itself as such" (50).

Mack struggles in these chapters with Herder's reputation as an anti-Enlightenment figure -- a thinker who is considered by some a founder of "nationalism and romanticism" (77). He convincingly argues that Herder, who doesn't privilege one culture over any other, remains true to Spinoza's spirit in embracing an attitude completely free of condescension (condescension being characteristic of less radical Enlightenment thinkers). The aspiration behind Herder's cultural relativism is not to "sacrifice universalism" for cultural diversity but to reconcile "the diverse with the universal," to embrace diversity in the name of universalism (77). On Mack's account, it is Kant rather than Herder who is responsible for the "scientific" racism emerging from the philosophy of the time (127). (As evidence, Mack is using mostly, if not exclusively, Kant's writings on anthropology and religion, which certainly contain some very unfortunate remarks. But Mack does not -- and, I believe, could not -- substantiate his interpretation of Kant as a racist by referring to Kant's more systematic practical principles.)

The concluding cluster of chapters extends this interpretation to literature and psychoanalysis. First, Goethe is read through the eyes of Rosenzweig: his "pagan," non-judgmental standpoint, revealed in Faust's encounter with evil (157-63) and in Iphigenia's encounter with the "non-civilized" (164-67), exemplifies a true Spinozist alternative both to the theological anthropomorphism that preceded Spinoza and to the anthropocentric philosophy that came after him (e.g., in Kant). Mack then moves to Eliot's appropriation of Weimar classicism in her attempt to distinguish "moral" ways of writing from "ideological" ones (169-74). (Mack shows beautifully how Eliot attempts to approach such an ideal style of writing in an interpretation of Daniel Deronda.) The book's concluding chapter is dedicated to Freud. Mack first portrays Freud' "new science" as a Spinozist challenge to the (allegedly) Kantian belief in "unambiguous self-knowledge" and the "autonomy of the rational mind" (196). (Kant's Paralogisms would challenge at least part of Mack's interpretation but are never mentioned.) He then analyzes Freud's critique of religion, suggesting that it perhaps is the ultimate Spinozist blow to anthropomorphic thought. Freud achieves this by undercutting Kant's attempt to bring humanity back to the center by performing a Copernican revolution on top of Copernicus' own.

One merit of Mack's project is that it continues to deepen our understanding of Spinoza's impact on Enlightenment thinking -- including, and this is significant, during the years preceding the Pantheismusstreit. Mack's portrayal of Herder as an Enlightenment figure is convincing, and even though he is not the first to propose such a picture (see, for example, Frederick Beiser's Enlightenment, Revolution and Romanticism), this is still controversial territory. (Sternhell's aforementioned book, for example, virtually ignores Spinoza and classifies Herder as a founding father of the anti-Enlightenment movement.) Moreover, I believe that Mack is fundamentally correct when he chooses to evaluate Spinoza's legacy by confronting it with Kant's. The commonly overlooked clash between Kant and Spinoza has recently received more attention (e.g., Paul Frank's All or Nothing), and it may deserve still more. I have doubts, which I will discuss below, about the interpretations of Spinoza and Kant that Mack is taking for granted. I also doubt that the Spinozist anti-teleological legacy is a successful (or, for that matter, desired) answer to Kant, an answer that can sustain a genuine commitment to diversity.

First, Mack's reading of Spinoza is unorthodox at best. Here is a Spinoza who "does not frame his analysis in an objectivist style" (38), who criticizes "absolute epistemology" (i.e., the view that we can ultimately know reality), who objects to the attempt to catch being by thought (50) and who is not, "contrary to common perception," a "determinist, as the term is commonly understood" (16). Many readers will find this hard to square with the straightforward p'shat of Spinoza's Ethics. Debates about the meaning of the geometrical method notwithstanding, Spinoza's style of writing is as objectivist as it gets; he argues that we can have adequate ideas (if anything, Spinoza downplays epistemology in the name of ultra-bold metaphysics), and he certainly seems to think that being (or existence) can be 'captured' by thought when he opens the Ethics by defining the causa sui as that whose essence involves existence (Ethics Id1). Moreover, most readers would agree that Spinoza is not a determinist "as the term is commonly understood" only to argue that he is, in fact, a necessitarian. Mack does not do much to defend his reading of Spinoza. The reading relies heavily on the fact that Spinoza views the mind as the idea of the body (e.g., 50). But by over-emphasizing this Mack makes of Spinoza the Kantian that he is not: Spinoza thought that despite (or even because of) the fact that the mind is the idea of the body we can gain an adequate idea of God -- of reality itself. He may have been wrong to think that, but this is a different story altogether.

Complementing this reading of Spinoza is an equally unorthodox take on Kant. The transcendental philosophy is presented as a version of the anthropomorphic absolutist epistemology that Spinoza had allegedly criticized, in which reality is created by the a priori workings of the human mind. Kant's role as the destroyer of dogmatic rationality is virtually ignored. To be fair, Mack at some point acknowledges that "a skeptical reader might object that Kant is not the philosopher of the limitless but of the limit" (130), and he provides some justification for his evaluation of Kant (130-2). But this brief discussion doesn't confront the two sticky reasons that bring a skeptical reader to insist that Kant is a 'philosopher of the limit' after all: (a) that the reality constructed by our mind is according to Kant merely phenomenal and (b) that far from aspiring to 'capture being by thought' Kant's critique of metaphysics culminates in his attack on the assumption -- crucially made by Spinoza -- that existence is a predicate.

This is not to say that we should not listen to Mack's intriguing inversion of the roles -- viewing Spinoza as a critic of reason and Kant as a dogmatist. There are ways in which this story can be told, for example when it comes to moral philosophy (130-2; 194ff.). I'm not sure that this will help Mack's ultimate aspirations, for he is interested in preserving some sort of morality after all, which Spinoza's critique may undercut (for, as I suggest below, isn't commitment to diversity a form of morality?) in the end. But in any case, Mack does not carefully distinguish morality from epistemology and metaphysics, and asking the reader to view Spinoza as a critic of reason and Kant as a dogmatist is therefore asking too much. Some of the book's arguments are consequently hard to accept. For example, Herder is said to provide a Spinozist criticism of Kant when he says that "it is wrong to attempt to grasp God via 'pure thinking'" (50). Also, it is claimed that, true to Spinoza, Rosenzweig advocates the "radical distinctness of world, humanity and divinity." In true "Spinozist fashion," we are told, "Rosenzweig insists on each entity as a substance" (141).

But let us put disagreements about Spinoza and Kant interpretation aside. The systematic question treated in this book is, as Mack says, of great current relevance: is Enlightenment universalism compatible with cultural diversity? Mack answers this question affirmatively, as we have seen, looking to Spinoza's non-teleological worldview as the key to the answer. Mack is not alone in this thesis. He joins Israel's attempt to advance Spinoza's radical position as an answer to the (post-modern) critique of the Enlightenment (see not only Radical Enlightenment but also the more recent A Revolution of the Mind).

I have great respect for this project, but the price of Spinozism as an answer seems to me too high -- so high, in fact, that the project must ultimately go bankrupt. It is only by flattening all value that Spinoza's non-hierarchical worldview enables acceptance of diversity, for value itself depends on the existence of hierarchies. One way to see this is to consider the notion of equality: to say meaningfully that everybody is equal is ultimately to say that everyone falling within a certain category is "more equal" than whatever falls outside that category. Indeed, this opens a dangerous door to the exclusion of someone (or some group) from the category of equals, but ensuring that no such exclusion occurs by insisting that everything is of equal value -- that is, that nothing has value at all -- is not much of a solution. In a true Nietzschean fashion, Spinoza's ethics culminates in the proposition that we never desire anything "because we judge it to be good" but only "judge something to be good" because we "desire it" (Ethics IIIp9s). Add to this the claim that human existence, rationality or desire has no normatively privileged position -- a claim Mack celebrates in Spinoza's attack on anthropomorphism -- and you get relativist nihilism. Talk of normativity here will have to be completely abolished or (what is the same) reduced to talk of power. Therefore, while it is true that Spinoza's radical position ensures cultural equality, it is far from obvious that it enables us to value diversity very much. (Mack at some point claims that Spinoza and Herder are not relativists but "realists" [19]; but this denial of relativism is not supported by a detailed discussion, and I'm not sure that it can successfully evade the nihilist tendencies intrinsic to Spinozist thinking.)

Kant, who seems to have recognized this predicament, responded by opening a gulf between nature and freedom. This dualism was crucial to Kant because, similarly to Spinoza, he defined the good through what is desired (recall the first formulation of the categorical imperative). Thus the main distinction between Kant's approach and Spinozist nihilism is Kant's reliance on dualism in positioning desire outside of the natural sphere, his ability to view it as rational will rather than mere desire. Moreover, regarding rationality (and humanity) as a part of some teleological order is crucial here also in order to view a rational will as a source of normatively binding claims (recall the categorical imperative's 'humanity formula'). Of course, it is far from certain that this Kantian enterprise is very successful. Few of us, including those commonly regarded as Kantian ethicists, will be willing to defend the messy metaphysics involved in Kant's dualism or his acceptance of teleology. But judging Kant as a representative of an old (and moderate) way of thinking is mistaken: the critical project is rather an attempt to deal with the nihilist potential that Kant detected in radical Enlightenment thought.


Beiser, F. (1992) Enlightenment, Revolution and Romanticism: The Genesis of Modern Political Thought, 1790-1800. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Berlin, I. (2000) Three Enemies of the Enlightenment: Vico, Hamann, Herder. London: Pimlico.

Cassirer, E. (1951) The Philosophy of the Enlightenment. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Franks, P. (2005) All or Nothing. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Israel, J. (2001) Radical Enlightenment: Philosophy and the Making of Modernity 1650-1750. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

-- (2009) A Revolution of the Mind: Radical Enlightenment and the Intellectual Origins of Modern Democracy. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Sternhell, Z. (2009) The Anti-Enlightenment Tradition. New Haven: Yale University Press

Spinoza, B. (1985- ) Ethics, in trans. Curley, E., The Collected Works of Spinoza, vol. 1. Princeton: Princeton University Press.