Spinoza Beyond Philosophy

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Beth Lord (ed.), Spinoza Beyond Philosophy, Edinburgh University Press, 2012, 272pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748644803.

Reviewed by Moira Gatens, University of Sydney


This anthology brings together ten chapters that first were offered at two conferences hosted by the editor, Beth Lord, through the auspices of the 'Spinoza Research Network' at the University of Dundee. (Both Lord and the Network recently have relocated to Aberdeen). In her brief introduction, Lord notes that the exceptionally broad interdisciplinary range of her contributors serves to take Spinoza's thought beyond the confines of academic philosophy and into the unlikely domains of architecture, ecology, musicology, and literature.

Spinoza Beyond Philosophy lives up to its title and should be of interest to the inquisitive reader as well as to Spinoza scholars. However, some of the essays treat more familiar topics in politics and the history of ideas. Like many others in the volume, Caroline Williams distances herself from orthodox Spinoza scholarship and prefers to present her work as thinking 'with and through' his philosophy rather than in terms of straightforward textual interpretation. Her opening contribution builds on the French tradition of Spinozan political theory (e.g., Louis Althusser, Etienne Balibar, and Jean-Luc Nancy) to sketch a materialist account of 'subjectivity without a subject'. This involves a reconceptualization of the concepts of conatus and imagination, where they are understood to function anonymously, or pre-personally, as the social carriers of 'transindividual' affects. In this complex essay, Williams argues for attending to the mass circulation of affect and its crucial role in politics, and she offers a new way to think about the composition and decomposition of various complex individuals (groups, collectives, nation states) as well as for analyzing the patterns of communication between them.

In the following chapter, Michael Mack's ambitiously wide-ranging essay deploys Spinoza's account of the imagination in order to posit the idea that it is literature and art -- not philosophy -- that are most able to close the gap between body and mind, affect and reason. Spinoza's philosophy of imagination and affect is here recruited to the task of creating an intriguing new after-post-humanism 'ethic of mindfulness'. Making creative use of Spinoza's scattered views on fiction, Mack argues against what he takes to be a Deleuzian conflation of imagination and representation that wrongly assumes that literature is fundamentally mimetic. Rather, the power of literature to promote acute awareness of the specificity of context, and to demonstrate our essential interrelatedness, should be understood in terms of the performativity of human experience rather than as mere representation or ideation.

Several of the essays are concerned with what Paul Crutzen has called 'the age of the anthropocene', that is, the era in which the human power to significantly harm the planet has become painfully evident. In chapter three, Anthony Smith tackles the looming environmental crisis through proposing the adoption of an affective ecology. Smith's affective ecology introduces a new sense in which Spinoza's metaphysics is radically immanent. He offers a close and evocative reading of Arne Naess' 'deep ecology' that was first published in the 1970s. Spinoza's prominent role in the 'affective turn' in much contemporary theory depends, I think, on reading his monism as amounting to animism, or an élan vital. Smith's reading of Spinoza cuts far deeper than past attempts of environmentalists to enlist him to their cause.

Spinoza's penchant for framing his thinking with the geometric method is paired with architectural ruminations in Peg Rawes' fascinating reading of the little-discussed passage about building a house in the Preface to Part IV of the Ethics. Spinoza presents architectural design and habitation as fully natural expressions of the human desire for self-preservation (conatus). Rather than conceiving of architectural expertise as an abstract skill that transcends nature, Rawes posits that for Spinoza 'geometric expression' is a psychophysical power capable of transforming nature in the endeavor to promote diverse forms of life. She concludes by gesturing towards how this understanding of the built environment could prove fruitful in the context of designing public space or respecting culturally diverse ways of dwelling in nature.

Spinoza had very little to say on the question of art (literature, painting, music), and many commentators have argued that, for him, the value of art must be either instrumental (it is good in so far as it promotes health) or as mere distraction. Amy Cimini boldly attempts to argue that despite first appearance, it is possible to reconstruct what a Spinozistic ethics of musical experience might involve. Distinguishing Spinoza's appreciation of music from Descartes' judgment that music is a matter of 'taste', Cimini explores how the epistemology presented in the Ethics allows one to conceive of music as a kind of adequate knowledge. The capacity of at least some music -- for example, Maryanne Amacher's experimental Third Ear Music -- to express and elicit active affects raises the question of whether it cannot also be considered as a source of adequate knowledge.

There is a delightful treat at the center of this book, simply titled 'Interlude'. In just eight pages, the work of a photographer (Lance Brewer), a poet (Christina Rawls), and a painter (Shelley Campbell) are presented along with short written reflections on the ways in which Spinoza's philosophy has influenced the works of the artists (the latter two artists are also students of philosophy). These images especially resonate -- at least for me -- with the essays that treat ecology, subjectivity, and art as expressed forms of knowledge.

Mateusz Janik's chapter returns to the question of the political through his critical analysis of the conception of 'the multitude' as it has been used in Spinoza studies by Balibar, Antonio Negri, and, more recently, Kiarina Kordela. Janik considers much contemporary political theory to err when it separates the social and the natural, the individual and the mass (Bruno Latour is, he notes, an important exception). The pressing problem for politics today, in Janik's view, is neither the problematic 'subjected-subject' of politics nor the equally problematic lack of an acceptable and viable organizing principle for politics. Rather, the practical problem is to understand what is the actual composition of social groups, what are their present modes of communication, and how might they be composed and recomposed over time? For Janik, addressing these pragmatic questions is what an ethico-political response to our present moment demands.

In chapter seven, Dimitris Vardoulakis addresses Spinoza's views on law and political theology. He argues that Spinoza's conception of law is fundamentally 'empty' because the theologico-political imperative is simply to obey the law, independently of its content: 'the aim of the law is the following of the law'. The difference between theologico-political and natural law is echoed in Spinoza's distinction between possibility and necessity. Natural laws cannot be broken and, unlike sovereign power, the laws of nature are absolute. On Vardoulakis' reading of Spinoza's political treatises, the dialectic between political power and nature's power is reflected in the endless play of agonism and monism that, he argues, serves as an adequate description of Spinoza's conception of the theologico-political.

In chapter eight Nick Nesbitt offers a bracing account of Spinoza's influence on 'black Jacobinism'. He cites the case of the Haitian declaration of independence in 1804 and Toussaint Louverture's 1801 constitution as essential -- and too frequently overlooked -- instances of what Jonathan Israel has called the 'radical enlightenment'. Nesbitt castigates Israel for his 'moderate' conception of what is taken to fall under the rubric of the 'radical enlightenment', and for his evasion of what it necessarily must encompass, namely, insurrection and defensive violence. On Nesbitt's reading, Spinozan radical enlightenment must be acknowledged as 'the pursuit of undivided, universal equality by whatever means necessary', including violence. According to Nesbitt, the 1801 Haitian revolutionary violence resulted in the establishment of the first slave-free state in the world.

In the penultimate essay, Simon Calder offers a change of pace with his presentation of the relationship between Spinoza's philosophy and George Eliot's narrative fictions. Mary Ann Evans translated Spinoza's Ethics in 1856, shortly before she commenced her career as the novelist George Eliot. Through an analysis of Eliot's neglected novella, The Lifted Veil, Calder shows how she simultaneously utilized and reformed Spinoza's remedies for the passions. Just as Spinoza recommends a rational reordering of the passive affects, so too do Eliot's narratives aim to effect an ameliorative restructuring of the reader's affective dispositions. However, Eliot's remedies remain essentially local and contextual and eschew Spinoza's more abstract, geometric treatment of the passions.

The final chapter of Spinoza Beyond Philosophy offers a fascinating account of an important episode in the nineteenth-century British reception of Spinoza's philosophy: S. T. Coleridge's writings on religion, Spinozism, and Spinoza. Nicholas Halmi offers a compelling argument for why we should understand the thrust of Coleridge's intellectual quest in terms of his hope of becoming the 'Christian Spinoza'. Coleridge's unrealizable ambition -- to provide a systematic philosophical grounding for Trinitarian Christianity that compromised neither his head nor his heart -- was what drove his idiosyncratic but profoundly influential reading of Spinoza.

Each essay in this thought-provoking anthology has something to recommend it independently of one's assessment of its feasibility as a reading of Spinoza. Bringing Spinoza into conversation with architecture, music, revolution, or literature, opens new paths of thought that may -- or may not -- yield new intellectual insights. Beth Lord must be commended for helping to create the context in which one can deliberate about the particular virtues and vices of these various conversations.