Spinoza Contra Phenomenology: French Rationalism from Cavaillès to Deleuze

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Knox Peden, Spinoza Contra Phenomenology: French Rationalism from Cavaillès to Deleuze, Stanford University Press, 2014, 357pp., $25.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804791342.

Reviewed by Bruce Baugh, Thompson Rivers University


The story of Spinoza's impact on twentieth-century French philosophy is one that badly needs to be told, which is not to say that it needs to be told badly. Knox Peden constructs links of filiation running from Léon Brunschvicg to Jean Cavaillès to Martial Gueroult to Jean-Toussaint Desanti to Louis Althusser to Gilles Deleuze, with Ferdinand Alquié and Albert Lautman included as interlocutors of Gueroult and Cavaillès, respectively. On the face of it, it's an odd list. Gueroult and Deleuze certainly belong on it as important interpreters of Spinoza, and Althusser and perhaps Cavaillès as thinkers inspired by Spinoza. The omissions are glaring, especially that of Pierre Macherey, whose five-volume commentary on Spinoza's Ethics is a monument of Spinoza commentary and offered an Althusserian rival to Deleuze's version of Spinozism.

The thinkers included share a concern for the most abstract elements of Spinoza's philosophy, particularly the relation of Substance to the attributes of Thought and Extension. Peden fore-grounds the tricky question of the relation of Substance monism to attribute dualism along with the related question of psycho-physical parallelism and the relation between true ideas and their objects. What Peden gives us is an ontological and epistemological Spinoza, the Spinoza of the first two books of the Ethics and of the Treatise of the Emendation of the Intellect. Spinoza the philosopher of desire and the conatus, the philosopher of affects and emotions, the philosopher of human liberation and beatitude through reason and the intellectual love of God -- the Spinoza of Books Three through Five of the Ethics -- is barely mentioned. This leads to an interpretation of Deleuze's Spinozism that leaves out most of what's interesting, such as Deleuze's exploration of Spinoza's dictum that "no one knows what a body can do," his controversial account of how good encounters between bodies can lead to a "composition" of the two bodies resulting in an increase in the power of acting and thinking of both (a position strenuously criticized by Macherey), and his Spinozist ethics based on the imperative, "become active!" It was precisely those aspects of Deleuze's Spinozism -- the vitalist, Bergsonian, Nietzschean elements (recall Deleuze's "great equation: Spinoza = Nietzsche") that have inspired "the new Spinoza," such as Antonio Negri's The Savage Anomaly and Subversive Spinoza.

What reasons are there for excluding so much of Spinoza, and so much of French Spinozism? The answer is three-fold. Peden's main objective is to contrast Spinozist rationalism with phenomenology and philosophies of lived experience. The rationalist emphasis focuses on the more mathematical and formal aspects of Spinozism. The emphasis on rationalist formalism supports an Althusserian "theoreticism" that wants to understand the world "scientifically" and eschews trying to change it. It is, at the very least, an interesting and provocative approach, leading Peden to put scare-quotes around "Substance," which he regards as a desubstantialized "idea" meant to account for the connection between the attributes of Thought and Extension (211), "nothing more than a name" for the relation between Thought and Extension within Spinoza's system (85-86), "purely ideational" and "formal, without any content in itself" (214).

In other words, this mathematical-formalist Spinozism is a rationalist idealism (which accounts for the inclusion of Brunschvicg) that is as far as possible from both the materialist Spinozism of some Marxists (such as G. H. R. Parkinson) and from the "God-intoxicated" Spinoza of Deus sive natura beloved by the Romantics. In Peden's phrase, Spinoza's Substance is "evacuated" of all content, "hollowed out" (131) in favour of a science of science (Brunschvicg, Althusser) (143-45), that is, the conceptual and rational comprehension of scientific systems -- which is what Althusser called "the reality of the theoretical 'concrete'" (151) -- such that matter itself is simply the idea of "matter" within a given science, the "object" of a scientific theory (46, 129-30). As for Substance, it merely helps Spinoza "establish the genetic, immanent, and procedural qualities of the rational" within a science (50), as if the Ethics formed the prolegomena to the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect. For that matter, since, according to Peden, Spinoza's rationalist system gives us a world governed by necessity in which things simply are and relations simply happen (260), with no practical or political implications and no possible evaluation of them (since any of these moves would amount to leaving the domain of absolute rationalist immanence) (259-65), it is hard to see why Spinoza called his great work Ethics rather than Rationalist Ontology.

Yet, despite the limitations Peden places on his project, it yields a wealth of interesting information about Spinozistic trends in twentieth-century French thought. The chapters on Cavaillès, Gueroult, Alquié and Desanti (chapters 1-3) do much to explain philosophers largely untranslated into English. However, the main purpose of these chapters is to frame the discussion of Althusser and Deleuze (chapters 4-7), the heart of the book. The main lesson of Spinozism, it seems, is that through a "militant attentiveness to the eternal and insistently repeated opposition between the idea and its object" (86-87), a "radical discontinuity of thought and its object" (189), in a thinking about concepts (Peden's version of Spinoza's "ideas of ideas"), which are themselves determined within immanent and autonomous domains of relations (sciences) and have no point of contact with anything outside the system (160-61), we can avoid "ideology" (179). This approach works particularly well in mathematics, which is why Cavaillès, Lautman and Desanti are so prominent in Peden's account.

Cavaillès is perhaps best known to Anglophone readers as standing (along with Bachelard and Canguilhem) within the stream of philosophers of "knowledge, rationality and the concept," which Foucault opposed to the stream of philosophers of the subject, experience and meaning (Sartre and Merleau-Ponty). For Foucault, both streams stem from Husserl's phenomenology, although the rationalist stream was based on Husserl's "formalism" and "intuitionism," whereas Peden sees Cavaillès' rationalism as standing in opposition to phenomenology tout court. Peden acknowledges Husserl's influence on Cavaillès (who was among those who attended Husserl's 1929 Paris lectures and later studied under Husserl in Freiburg), but Brunschvicg's influence predominated (29-38). Brunschvicg argued that "intuitive science is self-sufficient," independent of the historical contingencies of individual thought, and that truth arises from the "internal adequation" of products of thought to the activity that produces them, making truth "immanent to its own historical production" (37, 45). Rationality itself, rather than being a given, develops through a historical process driven by an internal dialectic towards greater completeness and unity -- in Cavaillès words, "a conceptual becoming that cannot be stopped" (53). All scientific developments presuppose the prior establishment of a problem that outlines its possible solutions without determining any of them (55), and the forward drive of this "dialectic of concepts" is driven by a criterion of adequacy which comes from the logical procedures of science, not from any comparison of concepts to "reality" external to science or from the self-evidence (évidence) of subjective experience (59-60). Criteria of truth and adequacy are completely internal.

How is this Spinozist? Peden relates Cavaillès to Spinoza's Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, which holds that "method" consists in seeking true ideas "in the proper order" such that they can serve as a standard for the intellect; any idea, in itself (formaliter), can be the object of another idea. For Peden, this means that "there is an experience of an idea" prior to the theory which places that idea "in a given knowledge of subject," and that "truth is immanent to its own historical production" (45). Yet although making an idea the object of another idea is a procedure which contains a sort of internal, logical "temporality" (the sequence enacted in the procedure), it can be worked out at any point in the history of any domain of thought, unlike the progressive development of science espoused by Brunschvicg or Cavaillès. Peden's decision to translate Cavaillès' expérience by "experience" rather than "experiment" can also be regarded as contentious (44).

Fortunately, the chapter on Gueroult and Alquié contains a genuine debate between Alquié's Cartesianism and Gueroult's Spinozism, each claiming to be more rational than the other. Both Alquié and Gueroult influenced Deleuze; both are cited an equal number of times in Deleuze's Spinoza et le problème de l'expression, the "minor thesis" which accompanied Difference and Repetition, and which Alquié supervised. Like his teacher Brunschvicg, Gueroult assessed philosophical systems in terms of their internal consistency, independent of the contingencies of history and individuals (71). In Spinoza, Gueroult finds an "absolute rationalism" whose "first article of faith" is the total intelligibility of everything through the total intelligibility of God (92), a system of truths in which everything is demonstrated and nothing is "given" (72), starting from "real definitions," as in mathematics, where the real definition of a circle is the operation or procedure that produces it, and proceeding by a synthetic-genetic method such that there is a rational order of interlinked demonstrations (80-82). For Alquié, system building, rather than insuring immanence, is an interpretation of the self-evident (les évidences) in the name of what is not evident that exposes the author to the risk of expressing his time and its errors (75). For Alquié, the évidence of cogito is both the starting point and the standard of truth, contrary to Spinoza's "I am thought by God," which is anything but évident (90-91). For Gueroult, it is the cogito that is occult and mysterious, whereas God can be rationally known, but not by acquaintance (87). For both, it comes down to an existential choice: either a philosophy of finitude, which makes death constitutive of our consciousness (Alquié), or "faith" in "the total intelligibility of things" through God (91-92). The incommensurability of idea and object, Thought and its infinite mode of the divine intellect, is the condition of "absolute understanding" for Gueroult, and the defeat of any supposed philosophy of immanence for Alquié (91). Peden's discussion of this debate is remarkably even-handed and brings out the strengths and weaknesses of both sides.

There are two reasons for including Desanti: he was Althusser's teacher, and he went from being a doctrinaire Stalinist to a philosopher of mathematics. Desanti studied under Merleau-Ponty, who brought him into a Resistance group with Sartre called "Socialism and Freedom" -- a group that did more theorizing than acting, which led Desanti to join the Communist Resistance. Desanti's 1956 Introduction à l'histoire de la philosophie presented Spinoza's famous Deus sive natura as reflecting the contradictions of the rising Dutch bourgeoisie, an "impossible synthesis" of theology (the past) and emerging modern science (104-114). In the 1960s, Desanti combined Spinozism with phenomenology, the commonality being that both attempted to reach a self-sufficient field of immanence within which everything could be generated from its constitutive structures. Althusser and Peden criticize Desanti for hanging onto phenomenology's "solipsistic" ego-pole "as a pole of unity assuring the synthesis of its acts" in a closed domain of sense-giving (101, 121), but Peden praises Desanti's main work on Mathematical Idealities (1968) for the theory that the axioms of a theory are the results of solutions of problems within a prior theoretical field, making scientific thought a "transcendental subjectivity without a subject" (125-26).

Which brings us to the core of the book: Althusser. Althusser is the "ne plus ultra of a rationalist resistance to phenomenology" (8, 164, 187), and one of Peden's main aims is to "rehabilitate" Althusser's reputation (11-13). "Althusser stands at the cumulative point of a trajectory of French Spinozism that has its roots in Cavaillès, if not in Brunschvicg himself" (145). The importance of Althusser lies in his efforts to distinguish science from ideology through the irreducible difference between an idea and its object. For Althusser, "economism" (the standard Marxist theory that the economic base determines the ideological superstructure) and phenomenology share the defect of trying to found knowledge on something external to the system being explained (131-35, 155-56). The alternative to the cogito is Spinoza's concept of the true idea as "factic," "a fundamental imposition of thought itself" (124) in which every true idea affirms itself and none is truer than any other (145-46) -- a view that at least on the surface is at odds with Spinoza's account of ideas in the Ethics as being "more or less" adequate, unless we take "true" to mean "fully adequate." For Spinoza, an adequate idea fully comprehends its own causes using rational principles, but Peden's interpretation is that ideas simply "are," "in themselves," and although they can be the object of another idea, they are "impervious to evaluation" (260).

Similarly, when Peden glosses Althusser's thesis that knowledge of necessity must be logico-deductive to mean that science does not search for "the putative 'causes' of events" (146) or that there are no "reasons" for an event extrinsic to the event itself (260), this seems to miss the whole point of Spinoza's Ethics, which is to liberate humans from slavery to the passions by understanding their causes and the place of human beings within a universal causal necessity governed by rational laws. In Peden's view, Althusser's objective is to grasp sciences in their "singular essences" without recourse to concepts drawn from ideology or lived experience (148): that is, to arrive at a true idea of a true idea, where "truth" is determined not by the correspondence of an idea to something transcendent to it, but by "understanding that the object of knowledge is radically distinct from the real object that occasioned it" (160-61, 189), a view that Peden grounds in the irreducible difference between the attributes of Thought and Extension (179). This may just be tenable as an interpretation of Althusser; as an interpretation of Spinoza, it is certainly debatable.

It would have made sense if Peden had followed the chapters on Althusser with one on Macherey, the most Spinozist of Althusser's students. Instead, we get two chapters on Deleuze, whom Peden casts as a Heideggerian Spinozist or a Spinozist Heideggerian (196), a rationalist irrationalist (234). These are the book's most provocative and least satisfactory chapters. Deleuze's frequent declarations of not being a Heideggerian and of being an empiricist-pluralist are ignored, and "transcendental empiricism" is reduced to a "hyper-rationalism" (196) with no mention of Jean Wahl. The "great equation, Nietzsche = Spinoza" is likewise passed over, and Deleuze's concern with "desire" is blamed on Guattari, although it is clearly present in Spinoza et le problème de l'expression. Peden does take note of the passage in Nietzsche and Philosophy where Deleuze says that what irrationalism opposes to reason is thought itself (234), but without ever clarifying what Deleuze means by "thought," which (as Deleuze asserts repeatedly) is not rational thought or reason but "a higher irrationalism": "A new logic . . . grasps the intimacy of life and death but without leading us back to reason".[1] It is of course quite legitimate not to take a philosopher's statements about his own philosophy at face value, but Peden's interpretation depends on ignoring or minimizing anything in Deleuze that counts against it and offering tendentious interpretations of what Deleuze means by "thought" and "Idea," confusing Deleuze's interpretations of others (Spinoza, Gueroult) with his own positions.

One of Peden's more interesting theses involves the comparison of Deleuze's virtual/actual distinction with Heidegger's ontological difference between being and beings. He points to a course Deleuze gave on Heidegger in the 1950s in which Deleuze says that in Heidegger there is no longer any distinction between that which grounds and what is grounded (200-201) which fits well with Deleuze's "flat" ontology and his insistence that the real conditions of real experience are no "broader" that that which they condition. But although Deleuze does want a science "of singular instances or events," it is hard to see how this is meant to subvert Heidegger's "irrationalism" (205).

Peden is right that Deleuze and Heidegger both want an ontology in which to be is irreducible to its concrete instantiations (210-15), just as Deleuze's "virtual", which is never exhausted by its actualizations (245-52). But what Deleuze opposes to Heidegger is not Gueroult's absolute rationalism (248), but a Spinozist theory of eternity and a Bergsonian conception of becoming, which, as Peden recognizes, allow Deleuze to reverse Heidegger's finite temporality of being-towards-death as a condition of authenticity into Spinoza's "a free man thinks of death least of all things" (see 223-30). Yet if Deleuze as a Spinozist affirms an ontology of infinite necessity (231), as a Nietzschean-Bergsonian he also affirms an ontology of chance in which the future remains open and creativity operates within natura naturans or the élan vital itself. Deleuze is at pains to distinguish between the determinism that operates at the level of finite modes and the self-production of Substance, which effects itself through its production of finite essences (degrees of power) and their corresponding modes such that Substance revolves around the modes through the eternal return (cited 212). In fact, Peden sometimes says that Deleuze excludes the category of the possible by substituting that of the necessary and sometimes that the possible is replaced by the category of the virtual. The latter is true. How it can be reconciled with the former is a problem that Peden does not solve, but any solution has to bear in mind that the category of "becoming" is central to Deleuze's system of thought.

"Problems" and "solutions" are also central to Deleuze's thought and to Peden's argument that Deleuze accords an ontological primacy to Thought over Extension. Peden rightly points out that problems are dialectical (in the Platonic sense of "dialectic") for Deleuze, and are never exhausted by their solutions, just as the virtual is never exhausted by actualizations (242-46), but it would be a mistake to interpret all problems as existing in the domain of thought. Deleuze says that although Thought understands all the attributes, including itself, there is nonetheless ontological equality between the power of thinking and the power of existing, which is why, indeed, Deleuze is a panpsychist (237, 240-41), and not an idealist. Although Deleuze's Ideas are "virtual multiplicities" incarnated by things, and although they can be thought, they are not, as Peden would have it, "assimilable to thought" (241); they are as much biological as mathematical. Ideas are "incarnated" in bodies existing in chronological time through the actualization of divergent tendencies within the virtual Idea (247), although the virtual never causes anything within the actual: Ideas condition "the attribution of a category of relation (substance, causality, community) to all the objects of possible experience" and so are prior to causality.[2] This presents numerous difficulties for Deleuze, but it does not show that Deleuze gives pre-eminence to "thought in its formal capacities, over all other aspects of existence" (252, 254). That reality is in part amenable to rational comprehension does not mean that rational thought exhausts the full reality of life.

Spinoza contra phenomenology, then. The attribute of Thought (universal, objective) contra the cogito (subjective, contingent); sub specie Aeternitatis contra temporal finitude; the irreducible difference between idea and its object contra the fusion of object with subject through "constitution" or "chiasmus." Yet, the philosophy of the concept has more in common with phenomenology than Peden allows. Phenomenology uses successive "reductions" (eidetic, phenomenological, transcendental) in search of an ever-elusive apodictic starting point. Althusser's reductions of ideology, the empirical and lived experience are in search of an ever-elusive clear dividing line between science and ideology. In the end, for Althusser and Peden "reason" is "rational" according to the procedures reason develops for itself, just as "science" is "scientific" according to its own methods and procedures and their history. Whether this is any less "solipsistic" than the cogito is for others to judge, but it does seem an effective evasion of "the material morass of existence" (220).

[1] Gilles Deleuze, "Bartleby, ou la formule," Critique et clinique (Paris : Éditions de Minuit, 1993), 104-105.

[2] Deleuze, Logique du sens (Paris: Éditions du Minuit, 1969), 342.