Spinoza & Dutch Cartesianism: Philosophy and Theology

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Alexander X. Douglas, Spinoza & Dutch Cartesianism: Philosophy and Theology, Oxford University Press, 2015, viii + 184 pp., $ 47,50, ISBN 978-0-19-873250-1.

Reviewed by Han van Ruler, Erasmus University Rotterdam


With his book on Spinoza and Dutch Cartesianism, Alexander Douglas has written an elegant and at times refreshingly daring book on the development of Spinoza's philosophical views and their historical background. Its broad strokes are sometimes less developed, particularly towards the end of the book, where Newtonianism comes into the picture, and Douglas generally makes lavish use of the works of others (especially Verbeek, and, with respect of Newtonianism, Schliesser), but a young scholar cannot do everything him or herself and one can appreciate the publisher's decision not to lay too much stress on scholarly detail where new vistas are developed, opening up new horizons of discussion. Not only does Douglas present an original way of questioning Spinoza and his contemporaries, he also offers an interesting combination of analytical philosophy and contextual research in the history of ideas.

The book's main theme is Spinoza's relation to his Dutch, Cartesian contemporaries. Reading Spinoza's position not so much in terms of its opposition to orthodox theologians, but rather as a reaction to contemporary followers of the new philosophy, some of the strategies and argumentative lines in Spinoza's own works are set into a wholly new light and alter our notion of what, exactly, was at stake. Spinoza, according to Douglas, blamed the Cartesians for hiding the ultimate consequences of their new way of thinking behind the implausible mask of a separation between the realms of natural science and theology, and developed some of his own themes as evidence for the view that the two domains could not, in fact, be separated.

Whether or not Douglas is right in arguing that Spinoza's position was, and still is, the only acceptable position in this debate, his way of reading Spinoza against the background of Cartesians such as Johannes de Raey (1622-1702) and Christoph Wittich (1625-1687) offers new and sometimes quite obvious interpretative schemes for understanding Spinoza. In combination with Douglas' analytical eye for distinguishing specific philosophical positions, this strategy helps to clear up some of the obscurities in Spinoza's works. Spinoza's identification of will and intellect is a good example. Saying that to have an idea "involves [its] affirmation" (p. 120), and accepting that, in this case, the term "idea" may also stand for the representational content of sensory experiences and imaginations, the identification of will and intellect was a tool Spinoza developed to illustrate that one cannot doubt on the authority of the will what one imagines as long as one simply imagines it. At the same time, Spinoza used the idea of the identification of will and intellect to exclude that one might continue to believe what one once imagined but what, on the authority of the intellect, good reasons have turned doubtful. Douglas' presentation of these points combines a fine analytical exploration of the epistemological questions involved with a frontal attack on Wittich's claim "that faith consists of an act of voluntary assent to something for which the intellect can provide no reasons" (p. 121).

Yet if Spinoza scored this point, Wittich's case was not entirely lost. My main point of critique on Douglas' position would be that although his interpretations help us to clarify Spinoza's standpoints, they do not prove the more general philosophical conclusion that Spinoza was right and the Cartesians were wrong. I think Douglas makes a convincing argument for the idea, for instance, that there was not very much to be found in Descartes with which to fight Spinozism. If anything, Descartes' metaphysical views, and especially his notion of God, invited Spinozism rather than that they prevented it. I would also subscribe in very general terms to Douglas' idea that the Dutch Cartesians fought a hopeless battle trying to convince their readers that natural philosophy was of no consequence to theology. Nevertheless, I very much doubt that, as Douglas seems to argue, it was Spinoza's metaphysics that offered the last word on these issues, or that it settled once and for all the question of faith and reason.

In fact, I think there are many reasons, both philosophical and historical, to doubt that we should present the battle over Descartes' heritage as a battle that Spinoza won game, set and match. In hindsight, we are prone to such strong secularist projections that it is hard not to follow Spinoza in his rejection of the Cartesian's double standards towards science and theology. This, however, does not necessarily imply that someone like Wittich, as Douglas writes "failed to show that Spinoza's theory of ideas, and his way of treating them, were deficient compared to those of Descartes" (p. 147).

Descartes himself may never have thought of the argument, but Wittich may actually have had a good point when he said that Descartes' innate conception of the ego should not heedlessly be transmuted into a Spinozistic conception of 'God'. Wittich's argument against Spinoza introduces the idea of 'second notions', a concept Douglas (on the authority of Verbeek) relates to Zabarella, but which was actually quite common in seventeenth-century logic and derived from the scholastic theory of 'intentions'. In its scholastic sense, the term intentio might simply be used as a synonym for what we call a 'concept' today. A 'second intention' (intentio secunda) was 'a concept of concepts'. Concepts corresponding to the words 'man', 'horse' and 'table', for instance, were called 'first intentions' ("primary concepts," we might say), while the concept associated with the word species, for instance, was a second intention, referring not to things, but to other concepts, like those of 'man', 'horse', and 'table'.

What Wittich's criticism would have meant for the notion of God and for the possibility of doing theology, is an anachronistic, though philosophically intriguing question. Maybe the concept of 'God' is epistemologically as problematic as the notions of 'cause' or 'substance', so that one should not, on Cartesian terms, take the concept of 'God' as seriously as one may take the concept of an actually experienced 'I'. The interesting thing in respect of the argument of Wittich's Anti-Spinoza (1690), in any case, is that Wittich offers all the reasons why Descartes' epistemology may be the more likely candidate to evoke a sceptical stance towards the supernatural, and why Spinoza is only building castles in the sky with his metaphysical journey into the realm of a substantial God and its supposedly all-encompassing 'Mind'.

If we do not want to speculate on what Wittich's arguments could have meant, and ignore the notion of 'God' for a moment in order to concentrate on the notion of 'substance', Wittich's argument is that, by taking substance as the norm for God and deducing necessary existence from the notion of 'substance', Spinoza deduces properties of things and conclusions with respect to their existence from notions that do not express things as they are in themselves, but only express the way in which we think of them. Douglas' reply to this argument is that Spinoza had meant to deal with 'second notions' elsewhere and that he must have regarded his use of 'substance', 'attribute' and 'mode' (as well as the 'idea of God's essence') as 'common notions' rather than 'second notions'. And since, according to Spinoza, common notions are always adequate on account of their universal applicability, all things necessarily imply the essence of which they all form part, that is to say, God's essence.

The question whether or not Spinoza himself assumed that he was using 'second' instead of 'common' notions is, however, beside the point. Wittich's argument is that Spinoza was in fact making use of second notions and I see no reason to doubt the truth of this. Spinoza hardly knew how to distinguish between the ideas of substance and God, and the way in which he presented both of these notions as common notions and thus as "the foundations of our reasoning" indicates to what extent he never foresaw Wittich's interesting view that our conception of 'substance' may well have no straightforward relation to how things are in themselves. To say, as Douglas does, that Spinoza's "presumed knowledge of God's nature" was "not God's nature as he conceived it, but God's nature as it intrinsically is" (p. 141) neatly gives away what Wittich found preposterous in Spinoza.

If Spinoza was such a theology-basher, why in fact did he continue to care so much about 'God's nature as it intrinsically is'? One cannot properly answer this question, I think, without acknowledging that the Cartesian-Spinozist controversy may not simply be reduced to an argument about whether or not philosophy had a right to launch a naturalist attack on theology. It was just as much an argument about the nature of theology itself. In his opening lines, Alexander Douglas points to the fact that " (in) one prominent tradition of pre-modern natural philosophy, the examination of nature both afforded understanding of the causes of natural phenomena and provided meaning and guidance to human life (p. 9)." The reference, of course, is to the scholastic way of reading finality into the natural world, which God had created with an eye to mankind. Montaigne, Bacon and Descartes had all offered reasons against this, and the latter's system of natural philosophy was meant to put an end to finalistic reasoning in the domain of physics. From a naturalist standpoint, it is tempting to regard Spinozism as the direct consequence of this development, but if one leaves it at that, one overlooks the fact that Spinoza actually tried to mend things here, and to return to a way of philosophising that combined both worlds, ensuring (in Douglas words) an "understanding of the causes of natural phenomena", as well as providing for "meaning and guidance to human life."

Spinoza had to do a lot of groundwork for making it possible to go against Cartesianism in this way. In Spinoza & Dutch Cartesianism, Spinoza's controversy with the Leiden Cartesians is presented, amongst other things, as a controversy about the question whether or not Descartes had himself left "metaphysical hints" (p. 64) for the development of a natural theology -- the very thing the Dutch Cartesians so categorically refused to accept on the basis of their Separation Thesis. In his Chapter on 'The Metaphysical Thoughts', Douglas makes a plea for Descartes' personal involvement with questions of natural theology and speculates about the way in which Descartes may have prefigured Spinoza's and Leibniz' ideas regarding the necessary creation of modes. Here again, the argumentation is quite irrelevant, since besides the fact that Descartes distinguished far more sharply between physical questions concerning the dispositions of matter and metaphysical considerations regarding the essence of God, Descartes had a completely different interpretation of the almighty character of the Almighty. If God, according to Descartes, overflowed with "superabundant power", this might still leave Him doing all sorts of things, and not necessarily be forced to realise an infinite production of necessary modes, as Spinoza presumed, or the idea "that every possible thing must necessarily exist" (p. 82), which is a very ambiguous statement of Leibnizio-Spinozistic metaphysics that Descartes would probably not have understood. In any case, there is no hint in Descartes that the idea of a powerful God implies the idea of a necessary emanation of being.

So much for metaphysics. From a historical viewpoint, the trouble with Douglas' chapter on 'The Metaphysical Thoughts' is that it hardly deals with Spinoza's Metaphysical Thoughts. Speculating about proto-Spinozism in Descartes, Douglas more or less ignores what Spinoza himself is essentially doing in the Cogitata metaphysica. Douglas' implicit assumption seems to be that what Spinoza presents in this text are questions of natural theology (especially ideas about God) that Descartes had not wished, had not dared, or simply had not found the time to develop. In relation to the Separation Theory, the question should rather have been whether Descartes should have done what Spinoza does here.

Spinoza's Cogitata metaphysica is indeed a difficult text to interpret, but its combination of a metaphysica generalis and a metaphysica specialis already gives away what it purports to be. With respect to the notion of 'God', the second part, the metaphysica specialis, is by far the most important. It is here that Spinoza introduces the idea, for instance, that God knows things in a way very different from our way of knowing things. Whereas we, in order to develop an idea, have to wait for an image of things to form within us, God produces things by having an idea of them. Spinoza's God, in other words, thinks the world into existence. This is only one way in which Spinoza sketches the outlines of a very intimate relation between God and nature. At the same time, the Metaphysical Thoughts, both in the first and the second part of the book, also emphasise that despite this intimate connection, there is room for duality as well, since there is a huge ontological distinction, according to Spinoza, between the eternal, infinite and substantial God, who is the cause of the universe, and the temporal, finite and accidental beings that are only the effects of this cause.

These, in fact, are Spinoza's first steps towards restoring the idea of a philosophy that may account for both "natural phenomena" and "meaning and guidance in life". It entails the reintroduction of a lot of quasi-Aristotelian concepts and ideas, and it is the kind of thing present-day naturalist readings of Spinoza tend completely to ignore.

An appreciation of Spinoza's metaphysical strategies would, I think, not only lead to a less anachronistic reading of his views, it would also open up a wholly different view on his relation to Cartesianism. It might, on the one hand, suggest new arguments in favour of De Raey's and Wittich's Separation Thesis. On the other hand, it would also offer an alternative reading of Spinoza's relation to the Leiden Cartesians. For not all Dutch Cartesians were ultimately interested in treating matters of motion and rest in purely physical terms. The Flemish philosopher Arnold Geulincx (1624-1669), for instance, was not. It is to Geulincx and to his tutor Abraham Heidanus (1597-1678) to whom we must turn if we are fully to understand Spinoza's philosophical interests and the crux of his attempt to offer a metaphysical basis for ethics -- but this will require an altogether different view of both the Leiden Cartesians and Spinoza.