Spinoza for Our Time: Politics and Postmodernity

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Antonio Negri, Spinoza for Our Time: Politics and Postmodernity, William McCuaig (tr.), Columbia University Press, 2013, 125pp., $24.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231160469.

Reviewed by Beth Lord, University of Aberdeen


This collection of four essays with an introduction continues the trajectory that Negri began so explosively with The Savage Anomaly (1981), although without that text's energy. Both there and here, Negri uses Spinoza's ontology to demand and defend a politics of the common. The "anomaly" is Spinoza's denial of transcendence -- anomalous for a seventeenth-century post-Cartesian philosopher -- and the potentialities that denial opens up. An immanent ontology redirects our modern thinking away from individualism, liberalism, and sovereign power, and towards a freedom that is achievable through the popular reappropriation of common desires and goods. For Negri, this places Spinoza "beyond modernity" and makes him a "postmodern" philosopher whose most important legacy is the idea of a democracy-in-progress that is continually constituted by the collective desires of the multitude.

The Savage Anomaly is a work of genius: written in prison, it draws the rivulets of Spinoza's thought into a raging river of political manifesto that moves with such speed and force that it cannot fail to sweep the reader along. With the work of Althusser and Balibar, it inaugurated a tradition of post-1968 Marxist Spinozism that continues to influence and appeal. Negri writes that The Savage Anomaly succeeded because "the perspective on Spinoza defended there revives the possibility of willing and acting consciously to transform or overthrow the capitalist mode of production, of asserting human equality and the human common" (pp. 2-3). That this is a fairly implausible position to take from Spinoza is not the point. Negri offers a new way of using Spinoza, and in particular, of using his ontology to ground an alternative kind of politics. His interpretation "might not do" for historiography, "but it [will] do for philosophy that . . . is there to pragmatically help us advance toward the realization of liberty" (p. 3).

By 'liberty' Negri means freedom in Spinoza's sense: a freedom that is achieved at the highest degree of one's power, and that is increased further when combined with the collective power of a multitude. Negri here retains a distinction, identified in his earlier book, between two senses of power in Spinoza: potentia ("potency"), the immanent and constitutive essence of a living being that desires what is good for its being, and potestas ("power"), the transcendent power of command assumed by rulers. Potentia gives us the potential to be free and to enter collectives with those with whom we share a common nature. Potestas can enable and encourage potentia, or it can be used to manage it, redirect it, or suppress it. Unlike political concepts of power, which merely rearrange the furniture of sovereignty and law, the ontological concept of potentia, for Negri, promises an absolute democracy that is continually, collectively constituted. For this reason, Negri insists that a Spinozan politics must be based on Spinoza's ontological text, the Ethics, and not on his two explicitly political treatises.

This is a short book, but it is not a quick read. About a third of it consists of an introduction in which Negri explains some of the themes carried over from The Savage Anomaly and defends his approach against other interpretations. The four chapters that follow are texts of conference papers, linked fairly tenuously by these themes. Chapter 1, "Spinoza: A Heresy of Immanence and of Democracy," is a 2009 lecture on Spinoza and politics today; chapter 2, "Potency and Ontology," is a 2006 conference paper pitching Heidegger against Spinoza; chapter 3, "Multitude and Singularity in the Development of Spinoza's Political Thought," is a 2007 conference paper on features of the singular and the common; and chapter 4, "Spinoza: A Sociology of the Affects," is a 2005 conference paper that situates Spinoza's concepts of desire and love within social life. While the four papers tread the same ground, they are disconnected pieces that do not build on one another. Negri's ideas are most effectively set out in the introduction and first chapter. The rest of the chapters, betraying their origins as spoken texts, are written for auditory fluidity rather than incisive reading; they neither clarify concepts nor develop them at enough length to allow for deep reflection. Reading these pieces demands more time and care than their length suggests, yet the ideas, once yielded, are frustratingly repetitive. Each chapter boils down to much the same thing -- and it is the same thing that was expressed so brilliantly in The Savage Anomaly. Negri's  new book functions neither as an introduction to his thought about Spinoza nor as a development of that thought: instead, it is a rather tedious vehicle for some exciting ideas that are better expressed elsewhere.

For me, the joy of reading Negri is that his ideas are both hugely attractive and utterly objectionable (generating just the sort of non-complacent thinking that, I suppose, Negri wants to invoke in his readers). One such idea, arching over the essays, concerns modernity. Negri posits that Spinoza is not "modern" because Spinoza's is not a philosophy of individualism. Spinoza is held apart from subject-centred modern philosophies and contractual political thinking that upholds sovereign power. In place of the individual subject with its free intentions and choices, Spinoza understands individuals as variable collections of bodies and desires. An individual -- whether a human being or a social group -- is always already a multitude, and constitutes itself in terms of that multitude's common desires for what is good for it. The Spinozan commonwealth and its institutions are not constituted through the free will or rational choices of individuals but by "multitude-making" through collective desire (15).

At the heart of modernity, then, Spinoza places "the hypothesis of government by the multitude" (17). Yet rather than concede that modernity is a complex thing with many faces -- as do those who argue for a "radical Enlightenment" -- Negri insists that Spinoza is post-modern. Spinoza "is inside modernity only in order to train his gaze on values that modernity precisely cannot express, because it has excluded them from its own foundation" (18).

This idea is undoubtedly appealing to those of us who seek in Spinoza answers to some of the problems generated and unsolved by modern democratic liberalism. Yet Spinoza's non-modernity -- if it is such -- does not entail postmodernity, which involves characteristic modes of thinking and writing that Spinoza demonstrably does not deploy. Even if we accept that modernity is reducible to individualism and contractualism, Spinoza's stance might more fittingly be described as pre-modern, drawing on classical, medieval, and Renaissance ideas of immanent causes, formal essences, and common notions. The "potency of the common and of love" that Spinoza posits as an alternative to the modern "potency of the individual" (p. 21) is surely evidence of a Renaissance, rather than postmodern, sensibility. To revive a Renaissance notion of the common against individualism might look revolutionary today; to do so in the seventeenth century looks conservative and even reactionary. Modernity is surely characterized by the very different ways that thinkers select and reject such elements of their intellectual inheritance. Spinoza is modern in this sense, and revolutionary only depending on our historical perspective.

Negri disapproves both of historicism and of scepticism about the power of common desire to achieve good political outcomes. Freedom is the aim and the product of human desire by its very nature; yet it is key to Spinoza's analysis that desire never operates in isolation from actual conditions that determine it in other directions. Spinoza worries about "the mob" that desires totalitarianism and war, but his point is much broader: both individually and collectively, people desire what their circumstances make them want, not what their shared nature determines is good for them. Capitalism, individualism, and liberal democracy -- and also sexism and racism, as Moira Gatens and Genevieve Lloyd have persuasively argued -- are, on Spinoza's account, products of human desire caught up in "collective imaginings" rather than true understanding.

Negri is not unaware of this, and he does not posit a "pure or primal" human desire. "All we wish is to keep on rebelling, here and now, enmeshed in this reality," he says (p. 49). It is a matter of transforming our actuality from within. Yet Negri is "hopeful" that in its ongoing rebellion, the multitude will desire a common reality of "living labor" freed from exchange value. Spinoza teaches us to be wary of hope: it is an inconstant joy about an imagined future, bound up with doubt and confusion. Negri declares himself immune to the charge that he is too optimistic about the multitude, without explaining why (pp. 29-30). If the reader insists that Spinoza believes that desire will always be misdirected and appropriated by more powerful forces, and that consequently Spinoza endorses strong rulers and laws, Negri will accuse her of basing Spinoza's political views on his political texts rather than his ontology (pp. 9 and 52). To this one can only respond by pointing out that the political texts are where Spinoza discusses the complications of actuality.

By what right does Negri move so seamlessly from ontology to actual politics? The answer presumably consists in Spinoza's uniquely immanent system. The best political formation is immanent in our shared human essence, which follows necessarily from God or nature. Does this mean we have "potential" for a democracy of the multitude? Undoubtedly yes, but it is not at all clear what that democracy would look like, or how it would actually function. Spinoza, again, tends to be conservative in his estimation, and avoids any hopeful prognosis of what democracy may become. By contrast, despite thinking that we should leave it up "to the multitude itself to decide what it wants to be" (p. 30), Negri is certain about what a politics of the common looks like. It looks collective, progressive, anti-hierarchical and anti-individualist. He trusts that the "postmodern" multitude will revive a pre-modern primitive communism that never was. This Marxist hope is nowhere to be found in Spinoza's corpus; what is so interesting is that his Renaissance thinking seems to give us occasion to revive it.