Spinoza: Metaphysical Themes

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Koistinen, Olli and Biro, John, (eds.), Spinoza: Metaphysical Themes, Oxford University Press, 2002, 265pp, 49.95 (hbk), ISBN 019512815X.

Reviewed by Steven Nadler, University of Wisconsin Madison


There is always room for another book on Spinoza. I would not say this about every great dead philosopher, least of all those with as quantitatively slim an output as Spinoza. But there still seem to be so many corners left to explore in Spinoza’s deep and rich philosophy, so many unanswered – even unasked – questions, that we should not begrudge yet another monograph or anthology that promises something new. Even those aspects of Spinoza’s thought that have received the most attention from contemporary philosophers – his metaphysics and epistemology – remain notoriously difficult and endlessly fascinating, and cry out for innovative and creative interpretations.

This new collection of essays, all previously unpublished, does a good job of focusing discussion on some important philosophical, interpretative and historical issues around Spinoza’s philosophy. The editors explicitly set themselves the task of producing a problem-oriented set of essays, self-consciously modeling themselves, they say, on Jonathan Bennett’s work on Spinoza. If what this means is that part of their aim is to add to the case for Spinoza’s continued philosophical relevance – as opposed to what may be his “merely historical” importance – then they have, to a large degree, succeeded. Many of the essays in this volume address pressing issues raised in and by Spinoza’s philosophy with the clarity and analytical rigor of contemporary metaphysics and epistemology but (for the most part) without losing sight of what Spinoza himself was really about.

Unfortunately, it is a rather uneven collection. Some of the essays are excellent, some are tedious, and one is downright strange. In a few of the essays, the authors bring current philosophical concerns to bear on Spinoza’s texts and do it well; other essays focus more on historical or textual questions. Several chapters are solid and interesting contributions by seasoned Spinoza scholars. A few are philosophical exercises that bear only the most tangential relationship to Spinoza. And a couple of the chapters have serious philosophical flaws.

If there is a theme that gives the volume some unity, it is “metaphysics”. This needs to be broadly construed, however. The essays are not limited to Parts One and Two of the Ethics, as one might expect, where Spinoza does most of his metaphysical foundation laying. There are discussions of his epistemology, his psychology and theory of moral motivation, and even of his views on the status of good and evil.

The book gets off to a rocky start in the Introduction. In their brief overview of Spinoza’s thought, the editors note, for example, that Spinoza calls his one substance God, and then “argues that this God causes all changes in accordance with the laws of nature” (4). This seems an odd way to describe God or Nature’s causal role in bringing about all things, and the unwary reader might be tempted to think of Spinoza as some kind of Malebranchian occasionalist. Spinoza’s God does not cause things “in accordance with” laws; rather, all things (including the laws of nature) causally follow from God’s immutable and eternal essences with an absolute necessity.

Michael Della Rocca’s chapter, “Spinoza’s Substance Monism”, takes a close and helpful look at Spinoza’s arguments for the claim that there is only one substance. He provides a careful approach to a number of perplexing questions about some early propositions in Part One related to the proof for monism. John Carriero’s “Monism in Spinoza” looks at the monism from the point of view of finite things, and suggests that Spinoza’s account of substance is motivated not so much by some general problem of individuation and ontological self-subsistence, as is often assumed. Rather, he says, the trouble with granting substantiality to finite bodies has to do with the nature of extension and the dependency of its finite parts. This implies, however, that the grounds for denying substantiality to bodies in Spinoza’s system would be different from the grounds for denying substantiality to finite minds; unfortunately, Carriero does not address this question naturally raised by his interpretation.

Olli Koistinen’s paper, “Causation in Spinoza”, is a textbook summary that begs more questions than it answers. For example, Koistinen says things such as “rocks and trees are properties or states of [Spinoza’s] one substance” (my emphasis), but this is a notoriously problematic way to read Spinoza and the relationship he posits between God and finite things. And his claim that for Spinoza, to say that if x causes y, then it is not possible to think of y without thinking of x, is a very simplistic, even inaccurate way of putting the central claim of Spinoza’s causal rationalism. What Spinoza means is that one cannot have a true conceptual understanding of y without employing the concept of x.

In “Concrete Logic”, Richard Mason analyzes Spinoza’s basic ontology of things and their relations, and offers an anti-logicist reading of Spinoza. While his point is surely right, it is not clear that anybody really adopts the position against which he is arguing – namely, that for Spinoza, causal relations between things really just are logical relations between propositions. Steven Barbone, on the other hand, also interested in the ontology of thing-hood for Spinoza, turns his attention to individuals. What, he asks, is an individual for Spinoza? He concludes that one necessary condition for being an individual is that it is something composed of various bodies, implying (but not arguing for the claim) that simple bodies do not count as individuals. This seems to be contradicted by Spinoza’s urge sometimes to qualify the word ‘individual’ by ‘composite’, suggesting that in principle a simple or non-composite body can be an individual. Nonetheless, Barbone does a good job of showing how the real locus of individuality in Spinoza lies in conatus and power, thus rescuing Spinoza from some well-known Cartesian problems about individuation.

Peter Dalton’s “Mirroring Spinoza’s Mind” is an interesting exercise, but does little to illuminate Spinoza’s account of how ideas in the mind are supposed to represent extended things. It is quite difficult to see how the inherently complex relationship of mirroring is supposed to clarify how ideas express or represent their objects; and its requirement of a causal element in the relationship between representans and representatum is, of course, highly un-Spinozistic.

By contrast, Don Garrett’s “Spinoza’s Conatus Argument” is a fresh, sophisticated, and insightful look at Spinoza’s argument for the conatus doctrine of Part Three of the Ethics, and does much to dispel allegations often lodged at Spinoza that his argument trades several times on the fallacy of equivocation.

Charles Jarrett’s “Spinoza on the Relativity of Good and Evil” examines four ways in which good and evil are relativized in Spinoza’s works, while Richard Manning’s long and complex essay, “Spinoza, Thoughtful Teleology and the Causal Significance of Content”, effectively addresses Bennett’s unconvincing argument that Spinoza rejects teleology even for human agents acting with motivated intentions. Jarrett makes as good a case as possible for the causal efficacy of mental content in Spinoza.

In “The Middle Spinoza”, Charles Huenemann looks at what he sees to be some differences between Spinoza (in the “Metaphysical Thoughts” appended to his exposition of Descartes’s Principles of Philosophy) and Descartes on a number of important issues: the identity of will and intellect in God, the necessity of all things, God’s moral character, and the relation of creatures to God. This paper raises some interesting questions, but, given its brevity, does little more than that. Moreover, Huenemann adopts a very unorthodox reading of Descartes’ conception of the relationship between will and intellect in God, insisting – against almost all odds – that Descartes keeps these really distinct in God.

Finally, Mark Kulstad, in “Leibniz, Spinoza and Tschirnhaus: Metaphysics à Trois”, considers the trilateral philosophical relationship that, he insists, played an important role in Leibniz’s intellectual development. Like most of Kulstad’s work, it is solid scholarship that affords a fascinating glimpse of Leibniz as he gropes towards his mature metaphysics.

Despite its flaws, there are enough philosophical and historico-philosophical gems in this book to make it worthwhile. Readers will find stimulating discussion of some well-known and well-worn problems, as well as new issues raised in a provocative and original ways.