Spinoza on Reason, Passions, and the Supreme Good

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Andrea Sangiacomo, Spinoza on Reason, Passions, and the Supreme Good, Oxford University Press, 2019, 256pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198847908.

Reviewed by Steven Nadler, University of Wisconsin-Madison


Spinoza's moral philosophy is finally getting the attention it deserves. After all, the oft-studied metaphysics, epistemology, and analysis of the passions that take up Parts One through Three of the Ethics are there to prepare the ground for what he has to say in Parts Four and Five about virtue, reason, freedom and happiness (which, in turn, is intimately related to his political project). There was a time when you did not need any hands to count the number of books devoted to Spinoza's ethical thought -- because there were none. Recently, however, a number of monographs and essay collections have appeared that directly address this central part of his system.

Andrea Sangiacomo's book is a very fine addition to this expanding list. Rather than concentrating on just the latter parts of the Ethics, where most scholars interested in Spinoza's moral philosophy focus and where we find his mature discussion of the "free person" who lives under the "guidance of reason", however, Sangiacomo is especially interested in the evolution of Spinoza's moral thought from his earliest writings to his final, uncompleted work. He considers tensions within, and pressures upon, Spinoza's understanding of the "Supreme Good" and how to achieve it, and the changes that that account consequently undergoes. Sangiacomo's thesis is thus both historical ("Spinoza's moral philosophy evolved significantly over time") and philosophical ("a new way of understanding the relationship between reason, passions and social embeddedness"). In his view, Spinoza's moral thought develops from an account grounded in what Sangiacomo calls "epistemic self-sufficiency" to one in which human flourishing depends on "certain kinds of social cooperation" (2-3). The upshot of his "cooperative reading" of Spinoza's theory of reason and the Supreme Good is that "Spinoza can be better qualified as an early modern defender of a highly relational account of moral progress and human flourishing" (3).

Sangiacomo begins with Spinoza's earliest extant writings, the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect/Tractatus de intellectus emendatione (TIE, ca. 1657-58, published posthumously in 1677) and the Short Treatise on God, Man and His Well-Being/Korte Verhandeling van God, de Mensch en Deselvs Welstand (KV, ca. 1660, not discovered until the nineteenth century). Already at this stage, Spinoza is committed to the idea that the Supreme Good is the knowledge of God (or Nature). This remains consistent throughout his philosophical career. What changes is the means to acquiring this summum bonum. In the TIE and the KV, "epistemic self-sufficiency" is the norm. The knowledge or adequate idea of God that is our goal is "innate" in the mind. The mind is, by its nature, ontologically and epistemically united with God, and so, as Sangiacomo puts it, "reaching the Supreme Good is nothing but acquiring the knowledge of this union" (34). All that we need to achieve such understanding (and the moral benefits it brings) is to draw ourselves away from the distractions (or, in Sangiacomo's lovely phrase, "existential noise") imposed by external causes -- the inadequate ideas or passions -- that prevent us from attending to our store of innate adequate ideas. The human mind, on its own, has the necessary resources to carry out this "improvement." External material and social circumstances, especially relations with others, may help us in this endeavor, playing what Sangiacomo calls a "tuning role", but they are not essential for the mind's progress toward its true good.

A similar story is at work in the KV, with a somewhat deeper analysis of the passions as the inadequate ideas that get in the way of the intuitive knowledge that unites us cognitively and immediately with God. In fact, Sangiacomo insists, the KV "offers a more complete exposition of [Spinoza's] commitment to the epistemic self-sufficiency of the mind already introduced in the TIE" (65).

However, trouble appears on the horizon. Sangiacomo finds it in Spinoza's correspondence with Willem van Blijenburgh. The problem is there from the beginning -- the absolute beginning. Adam, apparently, does not have an adequate understanding of God's command not to eat the fruit of the Tree of Knowledge. Just as bad, he has a false, anthropomorphic idea of God as a lawgiver. How is this possible, given that every human being has an innate adequate idea of God that, as Sangiacomo reads it, is always more powerful than any passion? After all, he insists that for Spinoza, "the love [of God] that true knowledge can produce is capable of overcoming any passion based on mere bodily enjoyment" (64).

One problem is immediately evident, although Sangiacomo does not address it: if the innate adequate idea of God is always more powerful than any eternally generated inadequate idea -- if, as Sangiacomo puts it, "the simple presence of adequate ideas should be sufficient to correct the inadequacy and emend the mind as soon as the mind attends to its innate adequate ideas" (69) --  why do we ever act contrary to our better judgment? In other words, if Sangiacomo's reading here is correct, then Spinoza in his early writings has no way of accounting for akrasia, or weakness/incontinence. Sangiacomo, on the other hand, takes the case of Adam to present Spinoza with an unfortunate dilemma: either God did not in fact reveal himself adequately to Adam (God's fault) or Adam did not perceive that revelation adequately (Adam's fault). Both horns of the dilemma are unacceptable, according to Sangiacomo. Obviously, we cannot lay the blame on God. But to lay the blame on Adam would be to imply that Adam, before "the Fall", was not perfect, not uncorrupted; in which case, what was the corruption brought about by the first sin? (I wonder, though, whether Spinoza, Jewish by birth and education, would be concerned with preserving a perfect and uncorrupted nature in Adam, since Judaism does not have a notion of original sin.)

There seems, however, to be an inconsistency in Sangiacomo's reading of the TIE and KV. On the one hand, he clearly finds in the early Spinoza an explanation for why, despite the innate presence of the adequate idea of God, we nonetheless fail to conceive of God adequately -- namely, the distraction by external causes that prevents us from attending to the adequate ideas. "Ethical progress consists in finding appropriate resources for avoiding these distractions and concentrating steadily on the (true) Supreme Good" (35). However, in his discussion of Adam in the KV, Sangiacomo is puzzled as to why, despite having an adequate idea of God, Adam nonetheless fails to grasp God's revelation with perfect rational clarity. "Spinoza's early ethical view", Sangiacomo notes, "did not leave him with resources sufficient to explain how Adam might act against his own knowledge of God" (72). But why cannot that explanation -- and, therefore, any sort of akrasia -- lie simply in that "distraction" by the inadequate ideas of the passions? (The Garden of Eden must have been filled with all sorts of lovely diversions.) Sangiacomo claims that Spinoza's "early theory dictates" that the true innate idea of God should be sufficient to "correct inadequate knowledge and oppose the passions"; and yet, Sangiacomo's own analysis of the TIE shows that this innate idea is often hidden from view.

Be that as it may, the tension that Sangiacomo finds in Spinoza's account is, he argues, significant enough to motivate Spinoza to modify his views. No longer will the "emendation of the intellect or the improvement of the mind's intellectual capabilities . . . suffice to oppose the power of the passions" (74). Superstitious beliefs, such as those of Adam, show that, as a matter of fact, even if human beings do have an innate, adequate idea of God -- and this claim is something that remains throughout all of Spinoza's texts -- nonetheless they fail often to actively conceive of God adequately. What Sangiacomo calls "the purely cognitive therapy of the passions" and the epistemic self-sufficiency in Spinoza's early writings thus eventually gives way to a more relational, even social account of the way to achieve our Supreme Good.

Sangiacomo regards the Theological-Political Treatise/Tractatus Theologico-Politicus (TTP, published anonymously in 1670), the next historical step in his itinerary, as "a significant departure from the radical intellectualist approach developed in the early writings", primarily because of what he sees as the important role that work gives to the imagination and the passions to engender a life of reason and knowledge, and ultimately the attainment of the Supreme Good (still conceived as the intellectual knowledge and love of God). No longer are external material and social conditions merely helpful "tuning" factors that facilitate a focus on innate adequate ideas. Rather, they are now necessary (but not sufficient) conditions for salvation. Moreover, and contrary to a mainstream interpretation of the TTP, the salvation that they contribute to is not a deficient, secondary variety -- different from the salvation achieved through the intellect -- but the very same salvation accessible to the philosophically sophisticated. What the TTP offers, in Sangiacomo's view, is a replacement of the "vicious circle" of passions that lead to ignorant wonder and superstition by a "virtuous circle" of passions that, while accompanied by wonder as well, gives rise to virtuous behavior.

This virtuous circle of passions/inadequate ideas is encouraged in the prophetic writings of the Hebrew Bible. The prophets are gifted in their ability to draw from wonder not superstition but devotion and, eventually, obedience to (God's) moral law and pietas (benevolence toward others), which in turn strengthens social and political bonds, which in turn facilitate the achievement of greater intellectual understanding. "Religious practice", Sangiacomo insists, "is an adequate means of leading people toward the Supreme Good insofar as it acts upon the external conditions that usually hinder individuals from naturally developing their intellectual faculties" (95). Instead of individuals starting with their innate adequate idea of God and what follows from it, with improvements in external conditions serving only to diminish the distractions caused by the body in the world, as the epistemic accounts in the TIE and KV have it, in the TTP, according to Sangiacomo, one begins with establishing, through the guidance of Scripture's moral message, practices and institutions that lead to "the creation of material conditions for the flourishing of the mind's power of thinking" (86). "Obedience" to God's law, then, leads not simply to moral behavior and a kind of poor man's "salvation" accessible to the masses, but to true salvation, just the kind that the philosopher achieves through the intellectual knowledge and love of God. The practices encouraged by Scripture are thus "instrumentally virtuous" because they are essential for helping people "progress towards the Supreme Good prescribed by natural divine law" (87).

Sangiacomo's reading of the TTP and of the Bible's prescriptive role in encouraging true virtue is creative and original, and well argued for. It also flies in the face of most scholarly opinion, which tends to see the virtue of ordinary, non-philosophical people in behavioral terms, consisting solely in the practice of justice and charity. Such individuals, edified by the stories in the Bible, are motivated not by reason (as it is in the case of philosophers) but by the imagination and the passions. Not everyone can be a philosopher and enjoy the Supreme Good, but at least everyone has a chance to live a life of virtuous practice and imitating the behavior of God as this literary character is depicted by the ancient prophets. For Sangiacomo's Spinoza, on the other hand, there is only one kind of salvation, and it is in principle available to all, with different people requiring more or less in terms of the material conditions that will allow them to flourish; and with some people, given their natural endowments, better suited than others to reach the final goal.

When Sangiacomo finally turns to the Ethics/Ethica (published posthumously in 1677), he is able to fill in the ontological and epistemological foundations for this necessary role that external conditions play in an individual's pursuit of the Supreme Good. The focus here is on what human beings have and can have in common with each other. Sangiacomo's goal is to show that external determination -- especially in social relations among human beings who agree in nature -- does not always have to result in passivity and inadequate ideas. Common notions, in particular, on Sangiacomo's reading, are based in experience -- causal interactions among individuals that agree in certain respects -- and these provide the basic material for reason and the generation of adequate knowledge of the "third kind", or intuition.

Sangiacomo's view on the origin of common notions is sophisticated and skillfully defended. He rejects the innatist view that common notions are part of the human mind's native endowment and insists that they arise from experience, although not by induction or abstraction. Rather, they are the correlate ideas in the mind of a property shared by the human body and another body, but the mind can form such ideas only when its body is actually affected by another body on the basis of this common property. This explanation, he claims, draws on the best of both worlds (innatism and empiricism). However, scholars who prefer an innatist reading -- and I count myself among them¾will find Sangiacomo's account problematic. After all, if, as Spinoza insists, the essence of the human mind just is to be the (adequate) idea of the essence of the human body -- this is the "eternal" part of the mind¾then the human mind must contain within itself, independently of how it is affected by other bodies, the adequate idea of the attribute of extension (of which the human body is a mode) and that attribute's "infinite modes" of motion and rest -- all of which are common notions. In other words, if, as Sangiacomo says, "common properties inhere in the human body and result from its nature or laws" (136), then the ideas of those common properties must follow from the idea of the essence of that body, that is, the mind itself.

Nonetheless, Sangiacomo's important point is that "while all inadequate ideas depend on external determinations, not all external determinations lead the mind to form inadequate ideas" (143). This is an essential feature of his case for the overarching claim that Spinoza presents "social life as the general external condition for fostering activity and rationality" (165). Sangiacomo's ingenious (albeit likely to be controversial) move is to argue that the distinction between actions (in Spinoza's technical sense of the word) and passions is not, as traditionally understood, between ideas that come from an individual's own resources and ideas that are caused by external things. He claims that if the causal network that generates an affect in a person involves another individual with whom there is "agreement in nature", and if that agreement is involved in bringing about the affect, then the affect is an "active" affect, since it essentially derives from the individual's own nature, albeit as that nature is embodied in and shared with another individual. In other words, external determinations based on "agreement" between items -- in the social case at hand, human beings¾can result in common notions and, thus, adequate ideas. Another strike against "epistemic self-sufficiency" as the means to the development of reason and the achievement of the Supreme Good.

What this means is that social interaction plays an important role in fostering agreement in nature among individuals. It does this through what Sangiacomo calls a "feedback loop" dynamic -- one that includes both joyful passions (based on agreement) and sad passions (based on disagreement) -- that brings individuals in society to "mutually adapt" to each other. This, in turn, means that society is also the set of conditions that allow individuals to "progress towards higher degrees of rationality" (166). In the book's final chapter, Sangiacomo turns to the Political Treatise (Tractatus Politicus, incomplete and published posthumously in 1677) and examines how Spinoza is concerned to show, in concrete terms, how at least two of the classical forms of government -- monarchy and aristocracy (Spinoza's truncated chapter on democracy was unfinished at his death) --  can create the appropriate conditions for fostering mutually cooperative relations among citizens and, thus, for increasing rationality among them.

This is a superb and creative study of central themes of Spinoza's moral philosophy and their development. Along the way, Sangiacomo also offers an account of Spinoza's philosophy of mind: the nature of the passions, the connection between truth and adequacy, epistemic relations between ideas, the containment of intellection and volition in ideas, and so on. Above all, Sangiacomo does an excellent job of integrating Spinoza's epistemology, psychology of the passions, and social and political thought into an illuminating developmental analysis of the core elements of his ethics. The result is a beautiful demonstration of the importance of looking at the Ethics not in isolation from Spinoza's other mature writings, but rather in tandem with them, all as integral parts of a grand moral and political project.