Spinoza on Reason

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Michael LeBuffe, Spinoza on Reason, Oxford University Press, 2018, 217pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190845803.

Reviewed by John Grey, Michigan State University


Even the most die-hard Spinozist will admit that it's not always clear how Spinoza's various claims about reason -- about its nature, its power, and its limits -- are supposed to fit together. On the face of it, many of his different uses of the term 'reason' have little in common with one another. When he sets out the metaphysical foundations of his system, the reason for something is just its cause. But then, in his treatment of epistemology, 'reason' refers to a certain sort of theoretical knowledge that we have -- for example, that all things share in certain universal logical, mathematical, or physical properties. Yet again, in his ethical theory, 'reason' refers to a body of practical knowledge, a source of guidance regarding how we ought to live and what ends we ought to pursue.

In light of all this, we might expect that our best strategy for understanding Spinoza's system will be to carefully disambiguate the many senses he affords the term 'reason' and to examine each in isolation, a divide-and-conquer strategy. However, this would only amplify the main interpretive problem that we face in understanding Spinoza's system as a whole. The Ethics begins with a purely descriptive, non-normative account of the cosmos and our place in it. By the end of the work, and apparently without introducing any explicitly normative or prescriptive principles, Spinoza invokes reason to draw a series of bold conclusions regarding how we ought to live. It has the feel of a magic trick. Every step of the process seems innocent enough, yet by the end it is apparent that something unexpected and radical has happened. But how? The divide-and-conquer strategy helps us get clear on the details -- we can see precisely where the magician's hands are at each step -- but it doesn't on its own make clear how the whole trick has been done.

In this book, Michael LeBuffe reverses the divide-and-conquer strategy to great effect. The idea animating his project is that, when we consider together all the different ways that Spinoza uses the term 'reason', we will be able to see how the relatively barebones conception of reason featuring in the early parts of the Ethics shapes and supports the rich conclusions he draws in his ethical and political writings. As he puts it, "Spinoza's uses of 'reason' . . . are systematically related in his argument and inform one another" (2). To this end, over the course of the book's four chapters, LeBuffe examines the way that Spinoza uses the notion of reason in many different domains. The first two chapters discuss his metaphysics, psychology, and epistemology, while the latter two cover his ethics and political philosophy. To see whether this ambitious project succeeds, let me canvass the ways that, on LeBuffe's reading, Spinoza speaks of reason in the relevant contexts.

The book begins with a lengthy discussion of Spinoza's use of the term 'reason' in his metaphysics, where it denotes a thing's cause or explanation. The central interpretive claim LeBuffe establishes in this rich chapter is that each finite thing is a partial cause of its own existence. Although part of the explanation that, say, there is a patch of mold on the cheese is that some fungal spores landed on it and the conditions were right for the spores to grow, part of the explanation must also be the nature of that mold itself. To defend this interpretation, LeBuffe offers a series of brief arguments based on a variety of texts. The main argument, however, is drawn from Spinoza's conatus doctrine, according to which "Each thing, insofar as it is in itself, strives to persevere in its being" (E3p6) and this striving is "the actual essence of the thing" (E3p7). LeBuffe argues that "Spinoza associates the power of creation with the power of preservation" (29), such that the essence of each thing is not just a power to preserve itself, but to cause itself. On this reading, the central difference between substance (i.e., God) and finite individuals (i.e., us) is not that God is self-caused while we are not. It is that God is fully self-caused while we are partly self-caused.[1]

LeBuffe next turns to an account of Spinoza's use of 'reason' in the context of his psychology and epistemology. There, the term denotes a particular sort of idea, namely, "common notions and adequate ideas of the properties of things" (E2p40s2). Spinoza famously contrasts reason with imagination, on the one hand, and intuitive knowledge (scientia intuitiva) on the other. One of the ongoing debates about Spinoza's account of reason has been about how to understand the difference between these three kinds of cognition. LeBuffe notes that Spinoza is part of a long tradition according to which "reason is a kind of faculty for the production of knowledge that human beings possess but that divine minds, because they do not require it, do not" (60). Spinoza rejects the faculty psychology but retains the view that reason is an imperfect kind of knowledge, falling short of intuition. But in what way does reason fall short of intuition?

Spinoza scholars are divided. Some say it is due to the fact that reason is mediated by demonstration or inference, while intuition is immediate. Others say it is due to the fact that reason grasps only the properties of things, while intuition grasps their essences.[2] LeBuffe argues that, since Spinoza sometimes speaks of intuitive knowledge as involving inference (e.g., at E5p36s), it is implausible to understand reason as mediated in a way that intuitive knowledge is not. Instead, "there is a clearer case to be drawn for a distinction between reason and intuition from the point that the former is not direct knowledge of a particular thing but the latter is" (98). The content of rational knowledge, not the method used to generate it, accounts for its subordinate status.

These two analyses of how 'reason' is used -- first in Spinoza's metaphysics and then in his psychology and epistemology -- serve as pillars supporting the central contribution of the book, an excellent chapter on Spinoza's account of practical reason. The interpretive difficulty is that reason's authority to issue prescriptions as well as its power to motivate action somehow need to be explained in terms of the barebones theoretical features I've described above. This is a challenging task. For instance, Spinoza holds that "He who lives according to the guidance of reason strives, as far as he can, to repay the other's Hate, Anger, and Disdain toward him, with Love, or Nobility" (E4p46). On the face of it, reason here (somehow) issues a prescription about how we ought to treat other humans. Moreover, Spinoza apparently believes that, when we judge that this rule is dictated by reason, this will (somehow) motivate us to follow it. How, though?

The central debate in the scholarship on this issue is based on the tension between these two explanatory tasks. In one of the most influential entries in the literature on this topic, Edwin Curley has argued that the dictates of reason are a series of hypothetical imperatives about what will be good for us on the assumption that we strive to persevere in our being.[3] (E.g., if you strive to persevere in your being, then you should repay anger with nobility.) Since Spinoza holds that, as a matter of metaphysical necessity, all things do strive to persevere in their being, Curley thinks these imperatives are hypothetical in surface structure only. Everyone ought always to repay anger with nobility, since everyone always strives to persevere in their being.

However, in another of the most influential entries in the literature on this topic, Donald Rutherford has argued against this interpretation.[4] Rutherford notes that, in spite of the conatus doctrine of E3p6, Spinoza does not really think we always strive to persevere in our being. We can be, and often are, led by our passions to go against reason's guidance. Moreover, Spinoza's view that all events unfold with perfect necessity implies that, in such situations, we could not have acted according to the guidance of reason. Rutherford concludes that Spinoza's dictates of reason are not prescriptive after all: they are simply descriptions of what someone who is acting rationally will do.

I describe this disagreement at length because I think LeBuffe's adjudication of it is the best and most important part of the book. The shortcomings of Curley's view have to do with its inability to explain reason's motivational power -- or, more to the point, its lack of motivational power when we are in the grip of various passions. But it still might serve, LeBuffe suggests, as an account of reason's authority:

why does the guidance of reason have authority, or, in other words, why does it give us a reason to act even if it does not always supply an overriding motive? The answer, Spinoza suggests, is that we ought to do what leads to perseverance because what we have reason to do, ultimately, is to exist. As we have seen . . . that is what any thing's nature ultimately is, a self-explaining reason. (132)

Our own (partially self-causing) natures account for the authority of reason. Of course, this leaves open the possibility that we may at times be indifferent to reason in spite of its authority over us. Yet LeBuffe argues that, even at such times, there is still a sense in which we will have a motivation to follow reason. The motivation arises from the fact that the prescriptions of reason follow from our stock of common notions, "truths about nature that are always and everywhere true" (134). Thus, reason's dictates "are continuously confirmed in and never contradicted in experience" (130). Because of this, even someone in the grip of a strong passion will naturally tend, after they are freed from it, to look back on their own past actions and see that they ought to have acted more rationally; and they will naturally be motivated to take steps to ensure they'll do better when next they are in the grip of such a passion.[5]

Stepping back to survey the picture, everything hangs together nicely. When Spinoza draws practical lessons from reason, the authority of those lessons is ultimately explained by the fact that we are each partial causes of (i.e., reasons for) our own existence. This fact about reason in its metaphysical guise explains why we ought to follow its dictates. And the power that reason has to motivate us derives from features of the common notions, namely the fact that they are constantly supported by experience and readily kept present to mind. This fact about reason in its psychological and epistemological guise explains why we generally want to follow its dictates. Finally, once we understand reason's authority and motivational power, we are in a better position to appreciate reason's role "as a source of social cooperation and coordination" (182) in his political thought. Thus LeBuffe weaves together the many different ways that Spinoza talks about reason in the various parts of his system. A Spinozist could hardly ask for more.

Well, perhaps a Spinozist could ask for a little more (though I'll try not to be ungracious): a clearer account of human reason, as well as deeper engagement with the recent scholarship on this topic, which draws subtle but useful distinctions that LeBuffe usually glosses over.

One of the more alienating aspects of Spinoza's account of reason is that it doesn't just grant rational knowledge to humans and other creatures very similar to us. For Spinoza's view is that we have rational knowledge of something whenever we share common properties with that thing. I have rational knowledge of this stone insofar as the stone and I share the property of being extended (for example). Yet this sharing of properties is symmetric: whenever I share properties in this way with the stone, it must also share those properties with me. Thus the stone has as much rational knowledge of me as I have of it.

The interpretive puzzle is that Spinoza also commits himself to the view that the human mind is more powerful than many other minds, including presumably the mind of a stone. Some passages expressing this commitment, especially E2p39c, make it sound as though even if he'd grant that the stone reasons, he'd also want to say that I reason better than it does. Yet on the account of reason just described, my rational knowledge of the stone is just as extensive as its rational knowledge of me. What then distinguishes human reason from that of the stone, or anything else? (Panpsychism hath given, and panpsychism hath taken away.)

On LeBuffe's reading, the relevant difference is that, due to their complexity, human bodies have many properties that stones lack, in virtue of which humans have rational access to many parts of the external world that stones do not (71). I agree that this is Spinoza's view. Intuitively, though, this view needs shoring up. Perhaps the main worry is that this accommodates the breadth, but not the depth, of human rational knowledge. Prima facie, it's not just that I know more things than the stone knows, it's that I know more things about the stone than it knows about me. It's not obvious how Spinoza should solve such puzzles, so it is disappointing that LeBuffe does not discuss them.

A separate concern is that LeBuffe's discussion neglects some important distinctions drawn in recent literature on the topic. In particular, he frequently appeals to the notion of natures or essences in his interpretation. However, Spinoza's own discussion of essence is remarkably difficult: sometimes, each individual appears to have a unique essence, while at other times he writes as if many individuals (e.g., all humans) share the same essence. Moreover, he sometimes distinguishes between actual essences and formal essences, but never deigns to explain the difference. While some recent scholars are careful to attempt to make sense of these distinctions,[6] LeBuffe does not. This makes it difficult to tell what precisely LeBuffe's view is, at some points. (I am a partial cause of myself in virtue of my essence. But is this in virtue of my essence qua individual, or qua human, or somehow both at once?) Had he engaged in greater depth with some of the recent scholarship on these issues, LeBuffe's view could have been clarified in greater detail, to the benefit of all concerned.

Yet these are small concerns in the face of such an important contribution to our understanding of one of the greatest philosophers. This book deserves a place on the shelf of any scholar of Spinoza, especially those who study him because they believe that he got things mostly right, and that, as Wallace Matson memorably wrote, "his is still the clearest chart of the way things hang together."[7] For LeBuffe's work beautifully illuminates the underlying unity of Spinoza's conception of reason -- and reason is the beating heart of Spinoza's philosophy.


Curley, Edwin. 1973. "Spinoza's Moral Philosophy." In Spinoza: A Collection of Critical Essays, edited by Marjorie Grene, 354-376. Garden City, NY: Anchor Books.

Garrett, Don. 2018. Nature and Necessity in Spinoza's Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Kisner, Matthew. 2011. Spinoza on Human Freedom: Reason, Autonomy, and the Good Life. New York: Cambridge University Press.

Matson, Wallace. 1977. "Steps Toward Spinozism." Revue Internationale de Philosophie 31 no. 119/120: 69-83.

Primus, Kristen. 2017. "Scientia Intuitiva in the Ethics." In Spinoza's Ethics: A Critical Guide, edited by Yitzhak Y. Melamed, 169-86. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Rutherford, Donald. 2008. "Spinoza and the Dictates of Reason." Inquiry 51 no. 5: 485-511.

Soyarslan, Sanem. 2016. "The Distinction between Reason and Intuitive Knowledge in Spinoza's Ethics." European Journal of Philosophy 24 no. 1: 27-54.

[1] LeBuffe's thesis that finite individuals are partial reasons for their own existence is extremely similar to a view that has been advanced by Don Garrett in a series of articles and book chapters over the past few decades. On Garrett's view, Spinoza repeatedly appeals to an understanding of finite individuals as "quasi-substances," which share to a limited degree the metaphysical properties of God -- such as being causa sui. The quasi-substance view is articulated across a number of chapters in the recent collection of his various essays and book chapters on Spinoza -- Garrett 2018 -- most prominently in his essay, "Spinoza's Conatus Argument." Strikingly, LeBuffe does not discuss any of Garrett's various articulations of this view, which makes it difficult to see whether and where he thinks his reading differs from the quasi-substance interpretation.

[2] See Soyarslan 2016 for an overview of the debate on this topic.

[3] Curley 1973.

[4] Rutherford 2008.

[5] The view has some affinities to Matthew Kisner's interpretation, according to which the dictates of reason acquire normative force when considered from the "practical perspective of an agent who desires to increase her power" (2011, 118 fn. 18).

[6] See in particular Soyarslan 2016 and Primus 2017; both profitably make use of such distinctions to get clearer on the nature and epistemic value of the different kinds of knowledge.

[7] Matson 1977, 83.