Spinoza Past and Present: Essays on Spinoza, Spinozism, and Spinoza Scholarship

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Wiep van Bunge, Spinoza Past and Present: Essays on Spinoza, Spinozism, and Spinoza Scholarship, Brill, 2012, 256pp., $146.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789004231375.

Reviewed by Steven Nadler, University of Wisconsin, Madison


What is remarkable about the explosion of interest in Spinoza over the past twenty years is not just its intensity, but also its breadth. Putting aside high and popular culture and the numerous novels, plays, artworks, and even operas that have Spinoza as their subject (not to mention the cafés, rock bands, and even food items and car washes that have 'Spinoza' in their name), there has been a great proliferation of scholarly attention given to this radical Dutch-Jewish philosopher. It is manifest not only in the field of philosophy, but also in intellectual and political history, religious studies (especially Jewish Studies), literary studies, and other disciplines. While there are few Descartes- or Leibniz-mavens outside of philosophy, fans of Spinoza are present across academia.

Naturally, the Dutch particularly appreciate the importance of taking a variety of disciplinary perspectives on one of history's most significant and radical thinkers. After all, he was one of their own and a central intellectual figure in their Golden Age. And Dutch historians of philosophy are generally more interested than their Anglo-American and French counterparts in the complexities of the historical, textual, religious, and political contexts of Spinoza's philosophy, its reception in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries, and the development of Spinoza scholarship up to the present time.

Wiep van Bunge, Professor at Erasmus Universiteit Rotterdam, is one of our most distinguished scholars of early modern philosophy, and the author of a number of important studies (in Dutch, English, and French) on Spinoza, as well as on Bayle, Descartes, and others. His new book is in fact a collection of essays, all but one of which have either been published elsewhere or are "based on" articles already published. While followers of Van Bunge's work will probably be familiar with at least some of these pieces, several of which originally appeared in Dutch, it is very nice to have them collected in one volume, all in English.

It is an eclectic volume, not in terms of quality, since they all represent the high standard of scholarship that we expect from Van Bunge, but in terms of subject matter. The essays are thematically very diverse, and they range over philosophical, historical, historiographical, literary, and political topics. There is not a "clunker" in the bunch, and it all makes for fascinating reading for anyone interested in Spinoza, in early modern Dutch intellectual culture, and even in contemporary Dutch politics and society. While not all the essays have Spinoza as their primary subject, he makes at least a cameo appearance in every one, and each essay does address some issue or other that is central to Spinoza's philosophy.

The first essay, "Baruch or Benedict? Spinoza as a 'Marrano'," addresses the question of "how Jewish was the greatest philosopher the Netherlands ever produced?" Van Bunge concludes, in essence, "Not very." He does a wonderful job of criticizing the "marrano hypothesis" promoted by Yovel, among others; Spinoza was not himself a converso, and it is hard to see how the converso experience sheds any light on Spinoza's mature philosophy. But Van Bunge takes issue with the broader claim that Spinoza's Jewish background is of importance in understanding his thought. As he notes in another essay in the book ("Spinoza Past and Present"), "no relevant connection has been established between the history of the Portuguese Jews living in seventeenth-century Amsterdam and the mature philosophy of Spinoza" (219). If what he means by this is that Spinoza's Jewish background and education are of no relevance for his philosophy, then I must strongly dissent. Van Bunge emphasizes the importance of Descartes, Hobbes, and contemporary Dutch republican thought, and rightly so. But, as recent scholarship has shown, it is wrong to ignore medieval Jewish philosophy when trying to make sense not only of the Theological-Political Treatise, where Spinoza explicitly confronts Maimonides, but also the Ethics. This is not to say that Spinoza is, as Van Bunge dismissively puts it, "an essentially Jewish thinker," or that Spinoza "remained at heart a Jewish thinker," but rather simply to take account of an intellectual tradition that was a critical part of Spinoza's education and philosophical development. (Full disclosure: my own work is one of the targets of Van Bunge's critique.) To be fair to Van Bunge, while I do think he has a bit of a blind spot here, he does end on an ecumenical note and with an open mind: "we are still waiting for a comprehensive re-assessment of the relevance for Spinoza's philosophy of such Jewish thinkers as Crescas and Maimonides" (14-15).

In "The Autonomy of the Attributes", Van Bunge turns to the issue of how to understand the relationship in Spinoza's metaphysics between substance and its (infinite) attributes. It is an old and notoriously difficult set of problems, first raised by one of Spinoza's correspondents: why is it that the attributes, each of which is eternal, infinite, and necessarily existing, are not each individual substances in their own right? Moreover, how can multiple attributes belong to one substance? Van Bunge examines the problem in its historical context, especially the way in which early commentators focused on it, while expressing his preference (following Machery) for a solution according to which we drop the "metaphysical monism" altogether and see the attributes as indeed substances, with Nature constituted by the collection of such substantial attributes.

In another primarily philosophical essay, "The Idea of a Scientific Moral Philosophy," Van Bunge looks at another long-time puzzle in Spinoza studies: the question of the relationship between (geometric) form and (philosophical) content in the Ethics. Can ethics be demonstrated with mathematical certainty? Van Bunge draws an interesting comparison with Locke, who in the Essay Concerning Human Understanding raises the possibility of such a scientific morality. Moreover, addressing the question of whether a scientific morality must be rendered in a Euclidean format, Van Bunge agrees that it need not, but that Spinoza's preference for such a mode of presentation is perfectly justified, given the causal determinism at the heart of his philosophy.

In "Spinoza and the Collegiants," Van Bunge turns to more historical matters, and examines the importance for Spinoza of his acquaintance with Collegiant personalities and ideas. He argues that what Spinoza learned from this dissenting Dutch sect was not so much theological but political. It was their emphasis on toleration, freedom, and equality that influenced Spinoza's own defense of those values and preference for democracy in his political writings. Another chapter that looks at the religious/political context of Spinoza's thought is "The Idea of Religious Imposture," in which Van Bunge provides an analysis of Spinoza's views on Moses' prophetic/political vocation by situating them with respect to earlier accounts of "religious imposture" used for political ends (e.g., Machiavelli).

The chapter "Causation and Intelligibility in the TTP" considers the contentious issue of religious "truths" by looking at the agreement between Spinoza's account of Scripture in the Theological-Political Treatise and the moral lessons of the Ethics. There are, Van Bunge argues, religious truths (despite Spinoza's separation of the domains of religion/obedience and philosophy/truth) conveyed by the prophets, and they are the same as the moral truths discovered by philosophy.

There are twelve chapters in the book, and I will not summarize all of them here. But I, for one, especially enjoyed reading the last few essays, since they covered material with which even the most seasoned Spinoza scholars outside of the Netherlands (and without a reading knowledge of Dutch) might not be familiar: the development and stages of Spinozism and Spinoza scholarship in the Netherlands and in Europe, extending from repression of Spinoza's works in the seventeenth century ("Censorship of Philosophy in the 17th Century Dutch Republic") to the emergence of Spinoza studies as a major academic discipline in the twentieth century.

In a critical discussion of the so-called "radical Enlightenment," and especially Jonathan Israel's volumes on the topic, Van Bunge questions, on good historical evidence, the notion of a single, coherent "Spinozism" in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries. There were, to be sure, anti-religious, libertine, and atheistic elements inspired by Spinoza within the radical branch of the Enlightenment, but there were also, as Van Bunge shows in the chapter "Radical Enlightenment: A Dutch Perspective," less anti-religious, more pious segments hoping to reconcile faith with reason. Not even the Spinozistic camp of the radical Enlightenment was a uniformly secularizing movement committed to the denial of the validity of revealed religion. "Even the coherence of Dutch 'Spinozism' as a single philosophical project, at the heart of the Enlightenment, becomes questionable. Perhaps we are best advised to regard 'Spinozism' as a common denominator of several historical 'projects'" (207). Van Bunge offers a convincing discussion of the consilience of the "morality" of the Ethics and the "true faith" (a religious faith) of the Theological-Political Treatise. Both are summed up in the ethical dictum to "love thy neighbor." "No major divergence," he insists, is to be found between these two texts. "The core of the moral philosophy developed in the [Ethics] shows at least a remarkable similarity to the morality Spinoza claims to discover in Scripture" (201). For Van Bunge, Spinoza remains an essentially and sincerely religious, if unorthodox, thinker.

It is worth noting, too, that Van Bunge sees great relevance in the debate over the meaning of the Enlightenment for contemporary Dutch and European society and politics, and begins his treatment of this topic with a discussion of recent events and controversies involving Pim Fortuyn (a right-wing, anti-immigration politician who was assassinated by an environmental activist), Theo van Gogh (a provocateur filmmaker who was gruesomely assassinated by a Muslim extremist), and Ayaan Hirsi Ali (a prominent feminist critic of Islamic fundamentalism).

Among the final chapters of the book is a critical survey of the development of Spinozism in the Netherlands in the nineteenth and twentieth centuries ("Nineteenth and Twentieth-Century Dutch Spinozism") and modern and recent trends in Spinoza scholarship, especially in Europe ("Spinoza Past and Present"). The former chapter examines how Spinozism, which experienced a lull in the eighteenth century in the Netherlands (Van Bunge notes that "Spinoza hardly played any part in Dutch High Enlightenment discourse"), regained traction in the late nineteenth century as primarily a "propagandist" movement among figures like Van Vloten, then entered a more "philosophical" (or levensbeschouwelijk, meaning "contemplative life") stage in the early twentieth century, finally reaching a "scholarly" phase by the 1960s with ground-breaking work by such Dutch and Flemish scholars as Hubbeling, De Dijn, and Klever. This survey of the life of Dutch Spinozism is both illuminating and useful, particularly as it places this "movement" in the context of modern Dutch history and (in the book's final chapter) allows for a comparison with recent trends in French and Anglo-American Spinoza scholarship.

In sum, this is a rich and varied collection of essays that will be of great interest not only to Spinoza scholars but to anyone interested in the Enlightenment and in Dutch intellectual history. It is a brilliant set of studies that illuminates the intellectual and historical contexts of Spinoza's philosophy, as well as its reception and influence.

Let me close by adding a word of praise for the series Brill's Studies in Intellectual History, in which this book appears. Brill has recently brought out a number of fine and important volumes on Spinoza (including Van Bunge's earlier book, From Stevin to Spinoza: An Essay on Philosophy in the Seventeenth-Century Dutch Republic, and a presentation by Leen Spruit and Pina Totaro of the recently discovered manuscript of the Ethics), on early modern intellectual history (for example, Erik Jorink's Reading the Book of Nature in the Dutch Golden Age: 1575-1715), and editions of primary texts (such as the translation of Arnold Geulincx's Ethics, with Samuel Beckett's notes). The books, all hardcover, are ridiculously and unreasonably expensive, but they are important additions to the scholarly literature. As university presses take on fewer and fewer "low level" projects, it is good to know that someone is picking up the slack.