Spinoza's Critique of Religion and Its Heirs: Marx, Benjamin, Adorno

Placeholder book cover

Idit Dobbs-Weinstein, Spinoza's Critique of Religion and Its Heirs: Marx, Benjamin, Adorno, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 275pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107094918.

Reviewed by Jason Read, University of Southern Maine


Idit Dobbs-Weinstein's book challenges many commonly held conceptions. First, while it is not uncommon to hear the names Marx and Spinoza mentioned together, not many add the names Benjamin and Adorno to the conjunction. The connection between Marx and Spinoza is generally framed these days through either Althusser and the works of Étienne Balibar and Pierre Macherey, or Antonio Negri and other members of the autonomist tradition. Second, while the critical theory of the Frankfurt School is grounded in such philosophers as Kant, Hegel, and Marx, Spinoza often appears less as a precursor than as part of what the critical theorists consider to be the dark side of the Enlightenment. I am thinking specifically of the passage of the Dialectic of the Enlightenment which states, "Spinoza's proposition: 'the endeavor of preserving oneself is the first and only basis of virtue,' contains the true maxim of all Western civilization, in which the religious and philosophical differences of the bourgeoisie are laid to rest." However, this is not the only dismissal: Benjamin cites Spinoza's Tractatus Theologico-Politicus only as a representative of the impoverished understanding of violence in natural right theory. There are other such formulations, and in each one Spinoza appears less as a precursor than as a symptom of the failures of Enlightenment thought. It is thus somewhat surprising to see Dobbs-Weinstein recast a line of descent moving from Spinoza through Marx to Benjamin and Adorno. This reordering of the various philosophical precursors follows Dobbs-Weinstein's larger argument for the repressed materialist (Islamic and Judaic) Aristotelian tradition. For Dobbs-Weinstein we have missed the former because we have missed the latter, overlooking a very different understanding of the practice of philosophy that she seeks to recover.

At the core of Dobbs-Weinstein's reading is, as the title suggests, a reexamination of Spinoza's critique of religion. For her the critical core of Spinoza's reading of scripture is less a matter of the anthropomorphic concept of God than Spinoza's engagement with the question of the ancient Hebrew State, and thus of the theological basis of worldly authority. For Spinoza the "chosen" nature of the Hebrew State must be understood as nothing other than the effect of its institution of the law and its particular practices. The result of these practices is that individuals became so habituated to the laws and institution that "obedience . . . appeared no longer as bondage, but freedom." The essential thesis of Spinoza's critique of religion, a thesis that is then picked up by Marx and others, is that religion as a set of ideas can only dominate, can only have its effects, if it is at one and the same time a set of practices. As Dobbs-Weinstein writes,

First, if a historical materialist dialectic is to be critical, it must simultaneously be a reflection of concrete material institutions and practices and of the ideology or forms of consciousness to which they give rise. For both Marx and Spinoza, this is as true of the philosophers' lofty ideas/ideals as it is of the "vulgar masses." Briefly and explicitly stated, throughout his writings … oppressive material conditions, be they religious, political, or economic, and the alienated forms of consciousness reflecting them can, without exaggeration, be said to be nothing other than the nineteenth-expression of Spinoza's repeated claim in the Ethics that "mind is nothing but an idea of body," stated explicitly in historical terms (73).

It is from this perspective that she reads Marx's notebooks on Spinoza's Tractatus Theologico-Politicus. Others, such as Alexandre Matheron, have questioned what these notebooks lack, such as any discussion of the Appendix to the Ethics, which, after Althusser, would seem to be the necessary starting point for a theory of ideology. However, Dobbs-Weinstein emphasizes what Marx focused on, namely, the passages that foreground the materialist basis of the domination of religion (77). This materialist critique of religion is the basis for Marx's assertion that religion is not only the opium of the masses, but also the heart of a heartless world. What Marx adopts from Spinoza is the assertion that religion must be understood as much as an effect as a cause, a product of its material conditions, as the ideal expression that in turn perpetuates these conditions. Dobbs-Weinstein rejects a fundamental teleology underlying Marxist theory, not just the teleology that posits history as the inevitable progression to communism, but the teleological progression that posits the critique of religion as necessarily prior to the critique of politics and culminating in the critique of political economy. For Dobbs-Weinstein the critique of religion is not the antechamber of true materialist critique, the critique of political economy, but a necessarily recurring aspect of critique. Religion is nothing other than the transformation of material conditions into ideas, the point where the existing social relations become metaphysics.

Dobbs-Weinstein's invocation of the seventh proposition of Part Two of the Ethics could be then interpreted as another point of articulation of the Marx/Spinoza relation. As such it would take its place alongside the already mentioned Appendix to Part One of the Ethics, the basis for Althusser's critique of ideology, as well as Negri's understanding of the multitude in the Political Treatise, as a point of philosophical transformation, where the propositions of one philosopher resolve the problems of the other, and vice versa. The entire history of Marxist/Spinozist scholarship can be understood as a history of similar points of articulation and transformation. They are points where the ideas of one philosopher transform and interrogate the ideas of the other. Here the critical point concerns the identity and non-identity of things and ideas, material conditions and their ideological expressions. It just so happens that it was Max Horkheimer, at the occasion becoming Director of the Institute for Social Research, who gave the clearest formulation of this problem. After stating that the fundamental problem of social philosophy is that of the connection between "the economic life of society, the psychological development of its individuals, and the changes within . . . culture," Horkheimer maps out the different philosophical responses to this problem according to three major philosophers. Horkheimer argues that a poor Marxism, what one could call vulgar Marxism, reduces everything to the first term, the economic life, while Hegel reduces everything to the second, the spiritual development of individuals. Lastly, Horkheimer adds, "that the economy and spirit are the respective expressions of one and the same essence: this amounts to a bad Spinozism." As much as Horkheimer's remark seems like an aside, like another one of the Frankfurt School's dismissive remarks about Spinoza, it touches on something central to not only the Frankfurt School, but dialectics in general: the necessity of thinking together identity and non-identity in ideology critique. Religion as ideology may be nothing other than its material conditions mapped differently, but this difference makes a difference. Thought has to be seen as a product of its material conditions, but still existing as thought.

The materialist understanding of religion as nothing other than its material conditions must then be coupled with an account of the difference between this expression and its material conditions. As Dobbs-Weinstein writes, drawing on another point of comparison between Adorno and Spinoza, this non-identity is the fact of history, of temporality. "Adorno insists on the intratemporal nature of all thinking and on its mediation by tradition" (62). Thought may be nothing other than its own historical conditions, but the words and concepts linger behind (or get ahead of) the material transformations, constituting the rhetorical density of thought, its fundamental untimeliness. Such an assertion explains not only the attentiveness to the specifics of language and rhetoric in thought in the work of Adorno and Benjamin, but also the tendency to "brush against the grain" of conceptual language for its rhetorical and mythic dimensions, finding the Odyssey to be a more accurate barometer of the constitution of bourgeois subjectivity than the philosophers who ushered it in. However, it seems to be completely out of place with respect to Spinoza, whose more geometrico and sub specie aeternitatis would be exactly the formalism and ahistoricism that Adorno criticizes. Spinoza too must be read against the grain, read not just for the declarations of his method but instead for its actual practice. The Theologico-Political Treatise is the clearest example of this, in that it engages with the question of God not as a theological question but as a rhetorical one, as something maintained in the language of "learned and unlearned alike," underlying daily superstition more so than learned theology. Moreover, even the Ethics, the very picture of the geometric method, is riddled with scholia which engage not the eternal truths of thought but rather its existing impasses in the fictions and imagination of its contemporaries. What is perhaps most striking about the Ethics from this perspective is that it takes popular superstition as seriously as an object of critique as Descartes or the Stoics. This is the recognition that philosophy cannot be separated from the weight of tradition. The materialist critique of religion from Spinoza through Adorno offers a way of thinking the materialist dialectic, of the identity and difference of thought and its material conditions, of the practices that condition any speculation, and the traces of rhetoric that linger long after their practices have disappeared. Philosophy is thus untimely rather than eternal.

Dobbs-Weinstein offers this dialectic more as a problem than as a solution. What reading Spinoza through the Frankfurt School offers is a new orientation of philosophy, one oriented towards the materiality of historicity, the materiality of rhetoric, and the politics of thought. (Of course, Dobbs-Weinstein argues that this orientation is not new at all, but constitutes a repressed tradition of Judaic thought.) As such, it can best be understood in terms not only of how it reorients Spinoza, turning from metaphysics to politics, but also of how it reorients the Frankfurt School, perhaps even developing a materialist conception of history and subjectivity where many have only seen the bleak pronouncements of "damaged lives," of those who survived the Holocaust and lived through fascism. It cuts against the tendency to both eternalize Spinoza, failing to see the conjunctural nature of his formulations, and the historicization of the Frankfurt School, failing to see the philosophical orientation underlying the conjunctural pronouncements on fascism, technology, and the culture industry. The latter can be seen in the following passage, in which Dobbs-Weinstein writes:

Adorno's radical critique of jazz is of a piece with his critique of actionism as a false form of praxis that believes itself to be free precisely because it originates in an unreflective form of consciousness that, to paraphrase Spinoza, is conscious of its appetite but unconscious of the causes, that is, the genesis, of its appetite in the culture industry (190).

Such a formulation has the immediate effect of shifting Adorno's pronouncements on jazz from his attachment to high modernism to a materialist basis of subjectivity. However, it also brings to mind contemporary readers of Spinoza such as Frédéric Lordon and Yves Citton, who have developed Spinoza's critique of the pretentions of liberal subjectivity into a critique of contemporary capitalism. The ultimate merit of Dobbs-Weinstein's book consists in breaking down the barrier that separated the Frankfurt School from the discussion of Marx and Spinoza, but that does not mean that conversation ends with this book.