Spinoza's Ethics: An Introduction

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Steven Nadler, Spinoza's Ethics: An Introduction, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 313pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521544793.

Reviewed by Michael LeBuffe, Texas A&M University


Spinoza's Ethics is a recent addition to Cambridge's Introductions to Key Philosophical Texts, a series developed for the purpose of helping readers with no specific background knowledge to begin the study of important works of Western philosophy. Steven Nadler accomplishes that aim admirably. He covers nearly every major position in the Ethics, including very difficult topics that are often neglected in the literature but which often interest or puzzle readers of Spinoza, such as the distinction between mediate and infinite modes in Part 1 of the Ethics or the account of the eternal part of the mind in Part 5. He does so, moreover, using a number of different tools likely to make the book of interest to a variety of readers. The book includes a clear, concise biography of Spinoza. Nadler makes numerous comparisons to Descartes, who was Spinoza's most important influence as well as a figure that may be more familiar to many readers. Where it is appropriate, he also introduces other important influences on Spinoza, including Cicero, Maimonides, and Hobbes. He compares discussions in the Ethics to parallel discussions in Spinoza's other works, making especially good use of Spinoza's letters, which enlivens debate and allows Nadler to raise in the voice of Spinoza's correspondents questions that readers are likely to have themselves. And, in the course of discussing the issues that have been of greatest interest to Spinoza's critics, Nadler refers readers to some of the most important recent work on Spinoza by philosophers, historians. and political theorists. So readers with specific interests in metaphysics, the philosophy of mind, ethics, religion, politics, or history will find some hook here to draw them into the Ethics. Nadler's book is comprehensive, engaging, and bright. It is sure to answer the questions that will strike a new reader of Spinoza and to raise new questions and productive lines of inquiry.

The book begins with an account of Spinoza's life. Nadler is the author of the best biography of Spinoza, Spinoza: A Life (Cambridge University Press, 1999), and this essay summarizes his account there. Chapter 2, a discussion of Spinoza's geometric method, includes a discussion of the formal apparatus of the Ethics. The highlight of Chapter 2 is an extended discussion of Spinoza's theory of definition in the course of which Nadler argues that Spinoza's definitions in the Ethics ought to be understood as real rather than stipulative definitions. All of the subsequent chapters follow the order of argument of the Ethics. Chapter 3, "On God: substance" describes the argument to substance monism at 1p14 (that is, Part 1, Proposition 14) and Spinoza's identification of God with nature. Chapter 4 concerns necessity and determinism. It includes a helpful discussion of the relation of Spinoza's "God" to traditional religious conceptions of God, something that does not interest many philosophical critics of Spinoza but which does continue, three centuries later, to raise eyebrows among undergraduate readers. In Chapter 5, after a brief discussion of Spinoza's parallelism -- the view that the order and connection of ideas is the same as the order and connection of extended things -- Nadler describes Spinoza's account of the human being and, in particular, the mind/body relation that Spinoza draws out of this central doctrine. Nadler makes extensive and apt use there of a comparison to Descartes. Chapter 6, following along the structure of Part 2 of the Ethics, focuses on epistemological themes: Spinoza's theory of ideas, his account of the three kinds of cognition at 2p40s2, and his identification of will and intellect at 2p49. Chapter 7 summarizes Spinoza's accounts of desire and the passions. It emphasizes Spinoza's naturalism about human psychology and what Nadler characterizes as Spinoza's egoism. Here the main comparison is to Hobbes, whom Nadler also takes to be an egoist. Chapter 8 is an account of some of the central themes of Spinoza's moral theory. One might emphasize any number of near equivalent concepts that Spinoza uses in Part 4 of the Ethics (the good, what reason commands, what is useful, what conduces to self-preservation). Nadler chooses to emphasize virtue and, what he rightly regards as a different kind of concept, Spinoza's model of human nature, the "free man." The chapter also features a brief discussion of Spinoza's political philosophy. Chapter 9 concerns, principally, Part 5 of the Ethics and Spinoza's use there of some of the terms of traditional eschatology, "eternity" and "blessedness." Drawing upon, especially, the medieval Jewish tradition, Nadler offers an interpretation of Spinoza as denying personal immortality.

Nadler takes few strong interpretative positions in his introduction to the Ethics. On topics of debate among Spinoza scholars, he typically refers readers to other sources rather than entering into argument himself. For example, on the question of whether Spinoza's account of the free man amounts to an argument that everybody ought to try to live like the free man, Nadler (pp. 237-238) merely mentions the dispute and refers to papers by Edwin Curley and Don Garrett, which he takes to offer different views on the issue.

Nevertheless, Nadler does, in a few places, defend particular interpretative views, and these parts of the book are likely to be of particular interest to specialists in the history of early modern philosophy. In his introduction (p. 58) of Spinoza's notion of attribute, which Spinoza defines at 1d4 as what the intellect perceives as constituting the essence of substance, Nadler mentions an important dispute concerning whether attributes are to be understood subjectively, as a way in which what is real is perceived, or objectively, as themselves real features of the world. Later (pp. 129-130), after his discussion of parallelism, which gives the reader more detailed knowledge of two attributes, Nadler argues for an objectivist reading, on the grounds that: first, outside of the appearance of Spinoza's initial accounts of attributes, considered in isolation, there is little evidence for a subjectivist reading; and, second, Spinoza clearly argues (1p9) that the more reality a thing has the more attributes belong to it. The second point is one that Martial Gueroult also emphasizes, a debt that Nadler clearly acknowledges. This is a compact, efficient argument that, at the very least, puts the burden of evidence on a defender of the subjectivist interpretation to show how it is that, on Spinoza's view, just from being able to be perceived in a variety of different ways, one thing can be considered to be more real than another.

In the philosophy of mind, Nadler defends (171-173) a particular account of what it is, on Spinoza's view, for a mind to be conscious. Traditionally, critics have either despaired of giving an account of consciousness in the Ethics or defended one of two interpretations. On the first option, which Nadler takes to have its principal source in Curley, Spinoza does not take ideas of body to be conscious, which is good if he can thereby save himself from making ordinary objects such as tennis balls, which have both mental and physical aspects, conscious. Spinoza does, however, on the first reading take ideas of ideas to be conscious. If it were true, on Spinoza's view, that only those things that we want to show to be conscious contained ideas of ideas, then the first option might be promising. Nadler argues, however, that Spinoza takes there to be an idea of every mode in every attribute. So, for a tennis ball, just as there is an idea corresponding to the extended tennis ball, so there is also an idea corresponding to the idea of the tennis ball. The first option, therefore, does not find consciousness precisely where we would like it to be. Nadler instead endorses the second option, which was entertained and rejected by Margaret Wilson and which Garrett recently has also entertained. On this option, it is the complexity of a mind that makes it conscious. Nadler helpfully defends the view that the human mind is complex, on Spinoza's account, by referring to the great complexity Spinoza finds in its extended counterpart, the human body. Then he concludes that, as the human body is extremely complex, so the mind is conscious.

The second option ought to be presented as one according to which some things are relatively more conscious than others, rather than in terms of what is or is not conscious, since anything, even a tennis ball, has some degree of complexity. So, according to this option, Spinoza is not saved entirely from attributing consciousness to tennis balls; he attributes to them a very confused and rudimentary kind of consciousness. This, of course, is a weakness of the view, and the grounds upon which Wilson rejects it. However, as Garrett has noted, it is also a strength for Spinoza insofar as it jibes well with Spinoza's naturalism in making the difference between human beings and tennis balls a difference in degree rather than in kind.

Nadler also takes an interesting position on the interpretation of Spinoza's remarks about the eternal part of the mind in Part 5, following 5p20. It is, as I have mentioned, a great strength of Nadler's book that he discusses those portions of the Ethics that many other commentators, because of their own lack of interest, do not. This will be a service to curious students of the Ethics who are regularly struck by Spinoza's claims about God, blessedness, and eternity. Another notable strength of the book, which I have not mentioned, is Nadler's ability to handle even very difficult and obscure parts of the book in a way that makes them accessible and invites readers to test interpretations where they might otherwise just be struck numb. Both of these strengths are evident at the end of the book, in Nadler's discussion of eternity. He rejects interpretations of Spinoza's account of the eternity of part of the mind as a kind of doctrine of personal immortality, arguing that neither consciousness nor memory survive the death of the body. Instead, Nadler sides with a line of interpretation on which Spinoza takes the eternal part of the mind to be a body of knowledge.

A strength of the discussion is Nadler's account of Spinoza's strategy in defending this conception of eternity. Instead of taking Spinoza to offer an alternative account of eternal life -- as if the eternity of one's knowledge without consciousness or memory to enjoy it could be enticing -- Nadler (p. 271) presents Spinoza as engaged in an attempt to show why a life of freedom and reason is preferable to a life guided by passions. Traditional accounts of immortality, on this interpretation of Spinoza's view, depend upon hope and fear as motives for submission to ecclesiastic authority. In demonstrating that genuine eternal existence is not personal immortality, Spinoza, on Nadler's account, attempts to weaken the harmful influence of these passions.

This is an excellent introduction to the Ethics, which will appeal to readers from a variety of backgrounds and which, at the same time, makes a substantial contribution to Spinoza scholarship. While acknowledging difficulties and obscurities in Spinoza's work, Nadler provides an account of the whole book that captures Spinoza's insights into metaphysics, epistemology, psychology, and ethics and shows them all to be parts of a single body of argument.