Spinoza's Geometry of Power

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Valtteri Viljanen, Spinoza's Geometry of Power, Cambridge University Press, 2011, $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107007802.

Reviewed by Michael Della Rocca, Yale University


It was an early instance of that very effective rhetorical move, "You're as bad as Spinoza". Leibniz charged in his "De Ipsa Natura" (1698) that, by denying power to finite entities, the occasionalism of Malebranche and other Cartesians "seems with Spinoza to make of God the very nature of things, while created things disappear into mere modifications of the divine substance".[1] The general worry here is that the occasionalists, like Spinoza, were guilty of removing any genuine nature from finite things and thus were guilty of stripping from them any causal power. In rejecting occasionalism, Leibniz -- as is well-known -- contends that finite things and substances in general or, to use a term he was then beginning to use at this point, "monads" have a nature of their own and have causal power that stems from that nature. Leibniz rightly sees his own view as, in many ways, a return to a pre-Cartesian view of the natures of substances, a view replete with teleology and final causes and all that good Aristotelian-Scholastic stuff. For Leibniz (and his illustrious pre-Cartesian predecessors), all causal power is a function of the essences or natures of things and, by eliminating the essence or nature of finite things, Spinoza -- as well as the occasionalists -- were guilty of saddling us with a world of inert objects.

This characterization and criticism of the occasionalists and of Cartesians may or may not be fair -- that's another story. But whether this is a fair criticism of Spinoza is the story of Valtteri Viljanen's book, and it is one of the book's great virtues that it explains just how wildly off-base this criticism of Spinoza is. Far from denying that things have essences and power, as an occasionalist might, and far from attributing causal power to things only as, at best, an extrinsic property of those things not grounded in their natures (as Descartes and other mechanists might have done), Spinoza, in an Aristotelian spirit, attributes robust causal power to objects as flowing from their essences. Thus, speaking of God, Spinoza says, "From the necessity of the divine nature there must follow infinitely many things in infinitely many modes (i.e. everything which can fall under an infinite intellect)" (Ethics 1p16). As Viljanen stresses, the demonstration of this proposition "turns on the tenet that 'the intellect infers from the given definition of any thing a number of properties that really do follow from it (i.e., from the very essence of the thing)''' (p. 41). Similarly, for Spinoza, particular objects that are mere modes of God also have natures that determine (at least in part) the properties of those things. As Spinoza says of bodies, "All modes by which a body is affected by another body follow both from the nature of the body affected and at the same time from the nature of the affecting body" (Axiom 1 after Lemma 3 of Part 2 of the Ethics). Viljanen aptly sums up Spinoza's view with the slogan, "things are essential causers of properties" (p. 41).

However, despite this genuine affinity with aspects of an Aristotelian view of causation, Spinoza is not fundamentally an Aristotelian in this matter. More than anything else, what, in Viljanen's eyes, prevents Spinoza's position from being fully Aristotelian is Spinoza's rejection of any form of teleology as playing a genuine causal role. Viljanen makes a powerful case for seeing Spinoza as denying that things are end-directed. Although Viljanen sees many virtues in recent readings -- particularly Don Garrett's[2] -- that accord robust teleology to Spinoza, in the end, Viljanen sides with more recent and traditional end-free readings of Spinoza. Here Viljanen's position is more in line with John Carriero's radically teleological-free interpretation[3], and I would say that Viljanen's criticisms of Carriero's reading (pp. 109-12) may not go very deep and do not take away from the fundamental similarity between these two interpretations when it comes to the rejection of teleology.

But without the teleology, without the final causes that were for Aristotelians often seen as the cause of the causes, where would the causal power of finite objects come from? Perhaps Leibniz is right, after all, that Spinoza has no room for real causal power. To avoid this charge, Spinoza turns, according to Viljanen, to the model of geometry: Spinoza's "doctrine of causation is derived from the geometry-inspired doctrine of being" (p. 4). Just as geometric objects -- which are non-real, non-concrete -- have a nature from which all their properties flow with necessity in a fashion that is not end-governed, so too objects in general have a geometrical structure (p. 2) and all the properties of objects are determined by their nature alone (this would be a case of adequate causation in Spinoza's terms -- see Ethics 3def1), or by that nature together with the nature of other things (this would be inadequate causation). In both adequate and inadequate causation, causation stems from essences alone in a non-teleological fashion. In this way, causation is immanent -- as in Aristotle -- but -- as in the occasionalists and in the Cartesians more generally -- is not directed by ends that stem from the natures of finite objects. As Viljanen puts the point, "Final causes are missing from Spinoza's world whose structure is modeled after geometry" (p. 178).

Further, by endowing objects with a perfectly intelligible structure in the geometrical style, Viljanen's Spinoza is able to see physical objects and objects generally, as well as their causal relations, as intelligible through and through (p. 2). This commitment to thoroughgoing intelligibility was something occasionalists and Cartesians typically were not able to achieve. I find this concern with intelligibility to be an especially attractive feature of Viljanen's reading, and, to my knowledge, this book gives the most detailed and insightful account of the way in which geometry guides Spinoza's metaphysics.

But how far does Viljanen's emphasis on the geometrical go in providing a locus of genuine causal power? Viljanen stresses that the geometrical order is only a model, for geometrical objects are -- in contrast to tables and rocks and dogs and God -- non-real. As Viljanen claims, for Spinoza, "unlike geometrical objects that are mere beings of reason (entia rationis), God is a real thing, indeed the most real thing there is (ens realissimum)" (p. 62). Other objects -- which Viljanen (though not Spinoza) calls "concrete" (pp. 15, 30) -- are also real though, of course, without being realissima. Without appealing to an order beyond the merely conceptual order of beings of reason, we cannot, according to Viljanen, account for the kind of resistance and real opposition that objects manifest in relation to one another. A conceptual order can provide, at most, for logical opposition or contradiction, but not real opposition, which, for Viljanen, Spinoza portrays as a genuine feature of the world in his conatus doctrine (Ethics 3p4-3p6) and elsewhere (see pp. 96-97, 101n46). Viljanen enlists the support of Kant to articulate the distinction between mere logical opposition and real opposition (p. 96). Viljanen also sees this bifurcation between the non-logical and the logical, between the real and the conceptual, at work in Spinoza's separation of the temporal order from the order of formal essences (pp. 22-23).

But, despite its Kantian pedigree, is this bifurcation between the real and the conceptual intelligible in Spinoza's own terms? The reality -- beyond the conceptual -- of my existence and power is grounded in the reality -- beyond the conceptual -- of God's existence and power. In order to make the distinction between the real and the conceptual intelligible, we must ask, "What does this reality -- either of God or of me -- consist in?" Viljanen's approach helps us appreciate the significance of this question, but his Spinoza does not seem to address this question directly (nor does Kant, for that matter -- but that is yet another story). The worry is that Spinoza's love affair with intelligibility as evinced by his geometrical model may be threatened by a potentially unintelligible distinction between the real and the conceptual. In light of this concern about the intelligibility of the distinction, we should perhaps revisit the question of whether, as Viljanen holds, Spinoza is committed to the distinction between the real and the concrete, on the one hand, and the non-real and the conceptual, on the other. And thus we can perhaps -- taking inspiration from Viljanen's approach -- take up again the vital question of how far we can go with Spinoza's geometrical model. How far can geometry -- governed as it is by "merely" conceptual connections -- take us? In interpreting Spinoza, can we go all the way and elide the difference between the real and the conceptual or is doing so something we will come to regret?

One of the great virtues of Viljanen's rich and sophisticated book is that, without going over this precipice, it brings us to the brink of taking this last momentous, wonderful, and perhaps terrifying step.

[1] G.W. Leibniz, Philosophical Essays, translated by Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber, Indianapolis: Hackett (1989), p. 165.

[2] Don Garrett, “Teleology in Spinoza and Early Modern Rationalism”, in Rocco Gennaro and Charles Huenemann (eds.), New Essays on the Rationalists, New York: Oxford University Press (1999), pp. 310-35.

[3] John Carriero,  “Spinoza on Final Causality”, in Daniel Garber and Steven Nadler (eds.), Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy, vol. 2, Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 105-47.