Spinoza's Heresy: Immortality and the Jewish Mind

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Nadler, Steven, Spinoza's Heresy: Immortality and the Jewish Mind, Oxford University Press, 2002, 190pp, $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199247072.

Reviewed by Martin Lin, University of Toronto


In his new book, Spinoza’s Heresy, Steven Nadler tackles a set of problems the solutions of which appear at once hopelessly obscure and blatantly obvious: why was Spinoza expelled from the Jewish community in Amsterdam in 1665? And, moreover, why is the language of the decree which enacts this expulsion, the cherem, so vituperative? The cherem was frequently employed by the Jewish community in Amsterdam in Spinoza’s day, but the one directed at Spinoza was and remains the harshest and most unforgiving. These questions are obscure because the documentary evidence is scant. Spinoza’s cherem is as vague as it is venomous, alleging no specific charges beyond “evil opinions and acts,” “abominable heresies,” and “monstrous deeds.” And yet their answers seem obvious because anyone familiar with Spinoza’s mature philosophical views will know that he denies any number of points of Jewish orthodoxy, e.g. that God, who is both wise and just, freely created the world, revealed the law to Moses, and that this law is still binding for Jews, who were and still are God’s chosen people. If Spinoza was any where near as skeptical about these points when he was a young man still living in the Jewish community of Amsterdam as he was at the time that he composed the Tractatus Theologico-Politicus or the Ethica, then expulsion would be the almost inevitable consequence.

Despite this unpromising situation, Nadler defends a hypothesis which is both surprising and intriguing. Although, argues Nadler, it may well be the case that at the time of his excommunication Spinoza was already claiming that God neither is providential, nor is benevolent, nor revealed the law to Moses, etc., and while such claims would have almost certainly earned Spinoza a cherem, the real mystery is why that cherem was so especially harsh. His answer is that a particularly aggravating circumstance was Spinoza’s claim that the soul is not immortal and that it dies with the body. This hypothesis is surprising for two reasons. First, while that the soul is immortal may be a mainstream opinion within Jewish rabbinic traditions, it is not entirely unambiguous. Furthermore, it is not a matter of law or ritual, and Judaism typically allows wide latitude on metaphysical matters. It is thus hard to see why denying that the soul is immortal would be the element of Spinoza’s philosophy that attracted so much venom. Second, it is not at all clear that Spinoza ever denies that the soul is immortal. In fact many prominent commentators have interpreted Spinoza’s remarks on the subject as an uncompromising defense of the immortality of the soul. And yet Nadler’s project is intriguing because it takes us right into the heart of the most difficult and interesting parts of Spinoza’s philosophy, as well as into the thick of the historical milieu in which the expulsion took place and which helped shape Spinoza’s intellectual development.

To make his case, Nadler first sets out the known facts surrounding Spinoza’s cherem, briefly discusses the heretical opinions on providence, divine law, and prophecy that Spinoza develops in his mature writings, surveys the basic positions on the immortality of the soul within Jewish theology and philosophy preceding Spinoza, offers an interpretation of Spinoza’s writings concerning the immortality of the soul according to which Spinoza denies it, and then makes a case as to why such a thing would be so upsetting to the Jewish community in Amsterdam in the 1650’s.

Among the most valuable parts of Nadler’s book are his discussions of the biblical and rabbinic traditions within Judaism concerning the immortality of the soul. This is, of course, a vast subject – one that couldn’t be adequately addressed in a single work, let alone a couple of chapters – and so Nadler’s treatment of it is, by his own admission, highly selective. He traces the issue of the immortality of the soul from the Torah, to the apocalyptic writings of the Apocrypha and the Pseudepigrapha, to the Talmud and the midrashim, and claims that while no unambiguous and definitive consensus about the immortality of the soul emerges from these works, a number of ideas coalesce into something like a mainstream view. Metaphysical mind-body dualism becomes more and more common as this tradition develops, and is linked to a belief in personal immortality and divine providential justice. What is more controversial however is what becomes of the soul when it stands before God’s judgment. Is it the soul alone, which is the subject of God’s judgment, or is it the soul reunited with the resurrected body? This is a question, according to Nadler, about which there is no dominant view within the Jewish rabbinic traditions. Here, as elsewhere, Nadler does an excellent job of summarizing and synthesizing a vast body of literature into an accessible and plausible narrative.

In the next chapter, Nadler explains the views on the immortality of the soul of two great medieval Jewish philosophers, Maimonides and Gersonides. Both are Aristotelians who believe that the soul can live on after death, retaining, however, only its intellectual powers. But according to Aristotelian metaphysics, substances are individuated by their matter. How then can souls be individuated after the death of the body? The response famously offered by Aristotle’s great Arabic interpreter Averroes is that they can’t, and hence all souls are one after the death of the body. How to both avoid Averroism and embrace incorporeal immortality is an issue that plagued Christian and Jewish Aristotelians of the Middle Ages. According to Nadler, the immortality of the soul in Maimonides amounts to nothing more than the persistence of the acquired intellect, the state of the soul when it acquires knowledge. This seems to reduce the immortality of the soul to the persistence of an abstract body of knowledge. So how can Maimonides have a theory of personal immortality as he insists he does? According to Nadler, this intellectualistic and not very personal account of immortality is extended further by his disciple Gersonides. Gersonides’ answer, according to Nadler, is that post-mortem souls are individuated by their differential levels of intellectual achievement. For example, if in this life I acquire knowledge of p and q, and you acquire knowledge of p, q, and r, then after death our souls are distinguished by the presence of knowledge of r in your soul and the absence of such knowledge in mine. As Nadler notes, this is a very tenuous conception of personal immortality, not least of all because there is nothing to guarantee that two people will not be identical with respect to their intellectual accomplishments and hence be indistinguishable after death.

In the next chapter, Nadler offers an interpretation of Spinoza’s views on the eternity of the mind. Spinoza’s views on this subject are notoriously difficult. So much so that commentators have sometimes concluded that they are incoherent – “rubbish that causes others to write rubbish” as Jonathan Bennett tartly puts it. One of Nadler’s main contentions in this chapter is that unless we see Spinoza’s views against the backdrop of medieval Jewish Aristotelianism, of which they are the “logical culmination,” they cannot be adequately understood. Spinoza sets forth his ideas about the eternity of the mind in Part V of the Ethics, from the scholium to proposition 20 to the end of the book. He writes:

The human mind cannot be absolutely destroyed with the body but something of it remains which is eternal.
This eternal part is: An idea which expresses the essence of the human body, sub specie aeternitatis, and which pertains to the essence of the human mind.

These claims are puzzling because they seem to suggest an asymmetry between mind and body. If mind and body are one and the same thing, now comprehended under the attribute of thought, now under the attribute of extension, then how can something of the mind remain if the body is destroyed?

One prominent solution to this puzzle is to simply deny the apparent asymmetry of this text. All essences are eternal, extended essences included. So the above text would have to be amended to include: “..and the human body cannot be absolutely destroyed with the body, but something of it remains which is eternal.” If that’s what Spinoza means, it would have spared his readers a good deal of confusion if he had just said so.

Another puzzle arises from the fact that Spinoza thinks that our conduct during this life can affect how much of our mind is eternal. If the eternal part is just the essence, how could anything we do affect how much of us is eternal? Nadler’s answer is that not one, but two parts or aspects of the mind are eternal. The essence of the mind is eternal, to be sure, but that’s not what Spinoza’s talking about when he says that we can bring it about that the greater part of our mind is eternal. What he is referring to is the adequate knowledge that the mind possesses. This part can be enlarged by acquiring more knowledge. Adequate ideas represent their objects sub specie aeternitatis. Because they are adequate they are in God insofar as he constitutes the human mind. That is to say, there is no ontological difference between an adequate idea in the human mind and an adequate idea in God’s mind. So the ideas by which we have adequate knowledge are eternal, and the more of them we possess, the greater part of our mind is eternal. Nadler, quite rightly by my lights, sees the post-Aristotelian Jewish tradition as an important precedent for this view. The mind is eternal as an impersonal body of knowledge. Thus the part of the mind which is eternal is like the acquired intellect of Maimonides and Gersonides.

Although Nadler’s interpretation is interesting and promising, he fails to address a number of interpretative difficulties. First of all Nadler assumes (and, to be fair, so, it would appear, does Spinoza) that if an idea represents something eternal, then the idea itself is eternal. But why should that be? Lots of representations of eternal truths are not themselves eternal. The paper on which a theorem of mathematics is written is not eternal though the theorem is. Secondly, Nadler assumes without argument that eternity for Spinoza is atemporal timelessness as opposed to everlastingness or sempiternity. But such an assumption requires a defense since those commentators who interpret Spinoza as holding a robust theory of personal immortality generally interpret eternity in Spinoza to mean sempiternity and the textual evidence is highly ambiguous. For example, Spinoza writes in Ep23s:

And though it is impossible that we should recollect that we existed before the body – since there cannot be any traces of this in the body, and eternity can neither be defined by time nor have any relation to time – still, we feel and know by experience that we are eternal.

Here Spinoza seems to say in a single breath both that the mind will exist after the death of the body, and indeed existed before it (!), and also that eternity has no relationship to time. The second part is the strain of Spinoza’s remarks on eternity that commentators like Nadler seize upon to make their case that Spinozistic eternity is atemporal timelessness. But it’s not even clear that such a notion is coherent. How can eternity bear no relation to time? How could there be any two things such that one bears no relation to the other? At the very least, the proponent of atemporal timelessness owes us an explanation of those passages where Spinoza seems to speak of the eternal aspect of the mind preceding and surviving the actual existence of the body. Commentators who favor sempiternity can rely on the work of Donagan, who has offered a meticulous reinterpretation of all passages which seem to support the atemporal reading of eternity. The proponents of timelessness must now return the favor.

In his next chapter, Nadler argues that Spinoza’s denial of personal immortality is a crucial element of his moral and religious thinking. With respect to religion, Spinoza notes that religious authorities often exploit the passions of their congregants, notably hope and fear, for the purpose of wielding power over them. This is deplorable since freedom and blessedness require a life of reason, free from the bondage of the passions. The doctrine of the immortality of the soul is one of the main vehicles for the manipulation of the hopes and fears of believers. The hope of everlasting bliss and the fear of hellfire serve to keep them under the control of the ecclesiastical authorities and separated from true happiness. With respect to morality in general, the denial of the immortality of the soul connects with Spinoza’s claim that virtue is its own reward and stands in need of no recompense in the form of some postmortem reward. This is true enough, and Nadler does a very nice job of presenting Spinoza’s basic moral and religious outlook in a clear and accessible form. I think, however, it would be fair to add that those commentators, such as Donagan and Wolfson, who think that Spinoza does have a robust notion of personal immortality, can and do accommodate these aspects of Spinoza’s moral and religious thought.

In the last chapter, Nadler returns to the question, why was Spinoza’s cherem so harsh? His answer is that his denial of personal immortality was a particularly aggravating factor. One reason for this is that in the 1630’s the Jewish community in Amsterdam was riven by a controversy on the postmortem fate of the soul. One group, motivated in part by concern for the fate of their converso relatives still living in Spain and Portugal, argued for the heterodox view that all descendants of the nation of Israel, regardless of their conduct in this life, would enjoy a share in the world to come. Another group held to the orthodox position that only observant Jews who upheld the law would be so rewarded. The disagreement was finally settled by an appeal to the Jewish community in Venice, but it was the most serious challenge to their unity and stability that the still new community had faced so far. No wonder then, suggests Nadler, that, when a young Spinoza comes along, just one generation later, arguing that the soul is not immortal, bitter memories of this divisive controversy were rekindled. Another possible reason is that the Jews in Amsterdam were concerned about how they would appear to their Christian hosts if they seemed to harbor among their ranks people who denied the immortality of the soul. The immortality of the soul could be seen as an issue on which significant overlap between Jewish and Christian doctrine existed, and the Jews, insecure about their position in Dutch society, would not have wanted to give the impression that the overlap was not as strong as it appeared. Also, there was the common view that belief in an immortal soul that would be punished for sin and rewarded for virtue was a vital support for morality. If the Jews were soft on the immortality of the soul, then wouldn’t they be soft on morality? For reasons such as these, Nadler concludes that, in the 1650’s in Amsterdam, the immortality of the soul was the wrong issue at the wrong place at the wrong time.

In short, Nadler’s book is an admirable piece of work. It relates Spinoza’s thought to a wide variety of contexts, each of which enrich our understanding of Spinoza. It is clearly written and highly readable, continuing the story begun in Nadler’s earlier Spinoza: A Life. It will be mandatory reading for students of Spinoza, as well as for students of Jewish thought and history more generally.