Spinoza's Metaphysics: Substance and Thought

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Yitzhak Y. Melamed, Spinoza's Metaphysics: Substance and Thought, Oxford University Press, 2013, 232pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195394054.

Reviewed by Charlie Huenemann, Utah State University


In this book, Yitzhak Melamed engages critically with recent attempts to reinterpret and refortify Spinoza's metaphysics, and contributes his own set of distinctions and spirited defenses to the project. He is concerned especially with presenting a new interpretation of how the various attributes of God relate to the attribute of thought. This leads to attributing a new flavor of dualism to Spinoza -- a dualism not of mind and body, but of ideas and things.

Part I presents a more general interpretation of Spinoza's monism. Melamed's principal aim here is to argue against Edwin Curley's influential interpretation, and at the same time to defend Spinoza from the objections raised early on by Bayle. In his 1969 book, also entitled Spinoza's Metaphysics, Curley argued that the relation between Spinoza's God and finite things is best understood not according to a substance/property model, but as something akin to the relation between laws of nature and particular facts. Melamed argues this leads to several untoward consequences, including not being able to say Spinoza was a pantheist, not being able to make full sense of critical concepts like immanence and inherence, and having to say that Spinoza's God cannot really know anything. I won't closely review these arguments or possible rejoinders to them, since this kind of objection has been raised many times before, and Curley has been able to supply ready defense. The matter always seems to revolve upon which set of problems an interpreter is least unhappy to face. While Melamed argues with deliberate care and precision in this section, it is the part that most reflects the fact that the book grew out of a doctoral dissertation.

Toward the end of Part I, Melamed offers several insights about the nature of Spinoza's infinite modes, entities practically unheard of outside his metaphysics. Melamed deduces what he can from Spinoza's scattered remarks, but is finally forced to conclude that we simply do not have enough information to say much about them. He does however raise a strategic question well worth pursuing: what would go wrong in Spinoza's metaphysics if he hadn't called forth infinite modes? Melamed's answer is that there would be a motley collection of finite modes, which did not possess any unity or exhibit any global regularities governing changes among them. Membership in an infinite mode constrains the behaviors and natures of finite modes in ways that eventually account for the patterns and lawful regularities we observe in the world.

Part II contains Melamed's innovative interpretation of the attributes of Spinoza's God. The problem he poses is this. God, we are told, has infinitely many attributes, of which we know only two, Extension and Thought. Each finite mode is expressed in every attribute, and the order and connection among them is the same across all attributes. But why then should we know modes in only two of these attributes -- especially as it would seem that an intellect should contain ideas of modes under every attribute? Why should our knowledge be so constrained? Furthermore, if Thought somehow does contain ideas of all modes under all attributes, how can its order and structure be the same as that of other attributes, which are blind to one another? It seems like Thought should include the others as proper parts.

Melamed argues for three interpretive claims that together will answer these questions. The first claim is that what Spinoza's interpreters have taken to be a single doctrine of parallelism  -- viz. that the order and connection among modes of different attributes is the same -- in fact turns out to be two separate doctrines of parallelism. First there is a parallelism between the modes in an attribute and the ideas of those modes ("ideas-things parallelism"). Then there is a second parallelism among all modes in all non-Thought attributes ("inter-attributes parallelism"). These two parallelisms are not the same. According to Melamed's arguments, they do not entail one another, and Spinoza justifies each of them independently from the other, even in texts where they follow on the heels of one another, such as in Ethics IIP7 and IIP7S. Furthermore, Melamed argues, ideas-things parallelism is only representational, whereas inter-attributes parallelism further entails the numerical identity of modes showing up differently under different attributes.

Melamed's second interpretive claim is that ideas are "multifaceted" in such a way that a single idea can represent modes under all attributes, but these facets are sufficiently separate from one another that one facet may have no inkling of the others. So the idea that constitutes your mind is an idea of your body; but this idea has infinitely more facets which represent that same thing in infinitely-many other ways -- say, as your shmody in the attribute of Shmextension. The general picture which emerges from these first two original interpretive claims is that we do not know of modes in other attributes because our minds consist only in the facets representing extended things (along with any ideas of those ideas, obtained through iteration). We are Extension-facet bound, so to speak. Moreover, Thought still has the same order and structure as the other attributes, but each mode of thought is infinitely multifaceted. This complexity is internal to the ideas, and thus is not reflected in the overall order and structure of the modes of Thought.

In trying to think this through, I cannot keep the two parallelisms from collapsing into one, despite Melamed's careful arguments to the contrary. If there is a parallelism among all modes of all attributes (except Thought), and there is a further parallelism between each attribute's modes and their ideas -- or idea-facets, rather -- then it seems to me that, transitively, we still should end up with the same parallelism running throughout. So what does the distinction really do for us? I also had trouble coming to grips with idea-facets. If an idea has infinitely-many facets, each facet being conceptually isolated from the others, why should this count as just one idea, rather than infinitely-many separate ideas? And, one wonders, is there any room in Spinoza's system for a conceptual barrier among facets of a mode of a single attribute? Aren't they all conceived through the same attribute? This all appears very murky to me; but more agile minds may be able to take this discussion further.

The third interpretive claim is the most interesting and important. Melamed holds that there is a profound divide between thought and being in Spinoza's metaphysics. This is not the same as a dualism between bodies and minds, which is a dualism found in every attribute between modes of that attribute and their ideas. It is rather a dualism between what a German Idealist might identify as "the Idea" and some other ontological expression of active, real, changing things: thought vs. reality, in every large sense of the terms. In Melamed's view, Spinoza is unique and admirable in his resolve not to try reducing one to the other: "Apparently, for Spinoza, being thought of or conceivable, is a feature as deep and basic as the very existence of things" (199). Even God, according to Melamed's Spinoza, finds a counterpart under the attribute of Thought; attributal dualism pervades Spinoza's substance monism all the way to the bottom. This pervasive dualism, he argues, keeps Spinoza from throwing in with the German Idealists, despite the fact that it was his metaphysics that made their intriguing philosophies thinkable in the first place.

Melamed has provided further insight into the relation between Spinoza and the idealists elsewhere, and he promises more in forthcoming works. In the meantime, as part of this wider project, Spinoza's Metaphysics offers plenty of metaphysical substance for Spinoza scholars to think through and express in their own multifaceted ways.