Spinoza's Radical Cartesian Mind

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Tammy Nyden-Bullock, Spinoza's Radical Cartesian Mind, Continuum, 2007, 164pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826485878.

Reviewed by Matthew J. Kisner, University of South Carolina


The first half of this book situates Spinoza's philosophy in the context of a political movement in Holland, "Radical Cartesianism."  The movement earns its name because it was inspired by the New Science, for which Descartes was emblematic, though Hobbes's work is just as important and, perhaps, more relevant to its aims.  The movement aimed to support DeWitt's republican regime, as well as to reform scholastic philosophy in line with the findings of the New Science.  As such, it stood for tolerance, intellectual freedom and popular sovereignty.  Whereas the first half of the book is most concerned with Spinoza's political work, the second examines his epistemology, metaphysics and philosophy of mind, focusing particularly on his views on error and falsity.  It describes the development of these views from Spinoza's earliest work in the appendix to the Principles of Cartesian Philosophy to their mature expression in the Ethics.  Nyden-Bullock identifies a transitional period, represented by the Short Treatise on Metaphysics (KV) and the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect (TEI), which reveals inchoate versions of mature doctrines.

Most of the first half examines the context of Spinoza's philosophy, beginning with the general political circumstances of the Dutch republic, especially the conflict between Orangists and the States-Party, represented by DeWitt's regime.  Then it turns to Radical Cartesianism, as it was expressed in academic disputes and political pamphlets, focusing particularly on the work of van Velthuysen.  Finally, it considers the Radical Cartesian views of Spinoza's fellows in the Amsterdam circle, with sections focusing on van den Enden, Bouwmeester and Meyer.  Nyden-Bullock uses this context to advance two bold claims.  The first concerns the motivation for Spinoza's project.  She rejects the notion that Spinoza's philosophical system arises foremost in the service of metaphysical and epistemological concerns, with his political views following as a consequence.  Rather, she argues that Spinoza approaches metaphysics and epistemology in the service of providing a thoroughgoing philosophical system that accounts for the politics of Radical Cartesianism.  The second claim concerns Spinoza's contribution to this background.  When examined in the context of Radical Cartesianism, many of Spinoza's views, particularly concerning politics, are less original than one might think.  His views on democracy, the role of religion and its relationship to the state, the power of the sovereign, and the significance and nature of reason are all in line with popular Radical Cartesian views.  Spinoza's contribution, rather, is in devising a philosophical system that justifies and systematizes these views.  Consequently, the second claim should not be regarded as diminishing Spinoza's significance.

This part of the book is particularly valuable because it provides a great deal of relevant historical background in one place, in a clear and economical manner.  While much of this material is already available, one often has to look hard to find it.  Furthermore, Nyden-Bullock covers some new territory as well.  In particular, she sheds new light on the work of those in Spinoza's circle, as well as van Velthuysen's pamphlets, written in Dutch and, consequently, inaccessible to many English language philosophers.  The latter is particularly important to connecting the views of Spinoza's circle to disputes about the proper place of Cartesianism in the academy and, consequently, to the public controversies that were of concern to DeWitt and Orangists generally.  For these reasons alone, the book is a must read for anyone interested in the historical circumstances of Spinoza's work.  More importantly, this work is valuable because Spinoza appears so different when read in this context.  It transforms our understanding of Spinoza's politics -- both its origins and significance to his larger project -- and also of parts of the Ethics.  With respect to the latter, Nyden-Bullock shows that Spinoza's emphasis on and understanding of salvation is indebted to Collegian influences.  This helps us to understand a point that often appears mysterious: why, given the radically anti-religious nature of Spinoza's work, he appropriated such traditional religious language and concepts and, furthermore, why he felt that any seriously religious person would find this appropriation compelling.

Turning to the second half of the book, the basic outline of the developmental account goes as follows: Spinoza's early view is largely Cartesian in its treatment of freedom, distinguishing a passive intellect from an active will, allowing the distinction between mind and body (and causal interactions between them) and conceiving of truth as clear and distinct perception and certainty (a lack of doubt).  In the transitional phase, Spinoza began to adopt many of the commitments that define his later work.  In the TEI Spinoza emphasizes the ethical significance of knowledge in helping us to understand our highest good.  Relatedly, while the TEI reiterates his earlier account of error, it adds a method for avoiding it.  The KV is different from the TEI in that it explains the relationship between mind and body and, relatedly, will and intellect.  In the KV, Spinoza now denies freedom of the will or even the existence of a will, distinct from particular volitions.  He similarly refuses to distinguish intellect and will, since he worries that this would commit him to claiming that they are entirely different, without common properties.  In making sense of these new commitments, the KV contains nascent versions of later claims, namely parallelism and the notion that individuals are properly understood as parts of a larger whole.  Finally, the transitional period marks a change in Spinoza's theory of truth, from the Cartesian conception to the notion that truth amounts to completeness of representation, described as either adequacy or the agreement of ideas with essences.

Nyden-Bullock acknowledges that many of Spinoza's transitional commitments are not sufficiently developed and defended.  Consequently, understanding this period is mainly valuable because it provides a window into the development of Spinoza's thinking.  While the history of early modern philosophy over the past few decades has become increasingly attentive to this sort of account, our understanding of Spinoza's development has not been as strong as our understanding of Descartes's and Leibniz's.  Nyden-Bullock helps to amend this situation.  Her main contribution here is showing how the transitional period retools and overturns earlier Cartesian commitments.  A main obstacle to this interpretive line is the difficulty of extracting Spinoza's own earliest view from his commentary to Descartes's Principles.  Divining Spinoza's views in this context runs the risk of wrongly attributing an early Cartesianism to Spinoza.  The author confronts this difficulty, convincingly showing that Spinoza's apparent Cartesian commitments from Metaphysical Thoughts persist, albeit in an altered form, in the TEI and KV.

Nyden-Bullock has made certain methodological choices that pose some limitations on what the text accomplishes.  Most notably, she engages very little with secondary literature and, then, only in footnotes.  Consequently, the book is not a good source for acquainting oneself with Spinoza scholarship.  This can also sometimes make it difficult to locate her commitments with respect to those of others.  Furthermore, the author has chosen to provide a very brief, concise treatment of the material.  The advantage is that it renders sometimes tedious historical material far more accessible.  A disadvantage is that it occasionally results in an incomplete picture.  For example, the de la Court brothers arguably held different positions; Johan, who died early, was fond of democracy, while his brother favored aristocracy.  Because of the timing of Johan's death, their early co-authored works argue unabashedly for democracy, while Pieter's later works shy away from these claims.  This change in their work was criticized by van den Enden, who argued for the superiority of democracy. Nyden-Bullock, however, glosses over these issues, treating the brothers as a single author and portraying them as ardent defenders of democracy.  While one should sometimes look elsewhere for the most thorough treatment of such historical issues, the book nevertheless excels at providing a synoptic picture that encompasses most of the relevant historical issues at a glance.

I should finally point out one shortcoming of the work.  The author does little to connect the two halves of the book.  She dives into the first chapter, foregoing any introduction explaining how the chapters are supposed to hang together.  The first paragraph of chapter 1 promises that the work "in the end explains how these developments relate to Spinoza's project of systematizing Radical Cartesian political theory" (1).  While a three page epilogue does set forth a few ways that Spinoza's mature philosophy supports Radical Cartesianism, it does not explain how the particular developments she describes in the second half of the work (for instance, Spinoza's changing view on the nature of error) are related to Radical Cartesianism.  This undermines the unity of the work, since the two halves are devoted to prima facie unrelated tasks.  Indeed the two halves of the book are arguably in tension: whereas the first half argues that Spinoza's philosophy is motivated primarily by the politics of Radical Cartesianism, the developmental account of the second half supports the more traditional view that Spinoza's thinking was motivated primarily by epistemological and metaphysical problems in Descartes.  Of course, the two halves are not necessarily in tension.  As I was reading, I often found myself speculating as to how the developments of the second part might have been motivated by Spinoza's Radical Cartesianism, but the author provides little guidance here.  Regardless of their relationship, however, each section of the book makes significant contributions to Spinoza scholarship.