Spinoza's Theological-Political Treatise: A Critical Guide

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Yitzhak Y. Melamed and Michael A. Rosenthal (eds.), Spinoza's Theological-Political Treatise: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 294pp., $89.00 (hbk),  ISBN 9780521882293.

Reviewed by Theo Verbeek, Utrecht University


Apart from the 'geometric version' of Descartes's Principia with an appendix containing 'Metaphysical Thoughts' ('Cogitata metaphysica'), the Tractatus theologico-politicus (TTP) is the only work of Spinoza published during his lifetime. Written in a difficult and elusive style, packed with Biblical quotations, switching on almost every page (sometimes even within a single phrase) from a theological to a philosophical register, badly organized and -- let us admit it -- without a clear and recognizable focus, the work constitutes a great challenge. No one should believe those who claim that in this work Spinoza has a clear message. Even the notion of libertas philosophandi ('freedom to philosophize'), which, according to the full title, would be the book's central concern, is not free from ambiguity. In any case, it is far from obvious in what way that notion provides an organizing principle for the book as a whole. Indeed, one of the questions could be to what extent the book is a whole, given the fact that Spinoza presents the book as a collection of 'some treatises' (aliquot dissertationes). As a result, a 'critical guide' is needed.

One would expect a critical guide to the TTP to provide teachers and students with reading help. More specifically, one would want an overall analysis and a thorough discussion of certain key notions. Preferably there would also be an assessment of the relation to Spinoza's other works, especially the Ethics and the Political Treatise. Particularly one would want information on the context. It is my view indeed that with the TTP Spinoza intervened in certain very specific political debates concerning the relation of Holland to the other provinces, the Dutch political system, the position of the Dutch Reformed Church as a 'public' Church, and the future of the United Provinces, even if large parts of the book were probably written with a different purpose. Finally, a 'critical guide' should contain a critical review of the relevant secondary literature. I am sorry to say that, despite the high level of scholarship displayed throughout this volume and the absolute originality of some of the contributions, this 'critical guide' to the TTP hardly meets those expectations.

Edwin Curley, to whom the volume is dedicated, contributes a fine article on 'Spinoza's exchange with Albert Burgh,' which culminates with a discussion of superstition, concluding that, after all, Spinoza finds it desirable for the state to sponsor a religion he himself believes to be superstitious. In Curley's view the 'universal creed' serves as the common denominator of all religious sects (that is, basically superstitious beliefs) and not as a philosophically purified religion. This is a good point, although it does little to solve the problem of the relation between superstition and 'true religion.' According to Spinoza, superstition is based on hope and fear, and that would mean that a non-superstitious religion must not be based on hope and fear. Accordingly, it would not be the precise contents of a belief that makes it superstitious, but the feelings associated with it. I believe the key concept here is devotion (as, for example, in TTP v, III, 75, 77, 78; vi, III, 90; xii, III, 146[1]), an emotion essentially different from hope and fear because it is based on love.

Piet Steenbakkers gives an excellent introduction to the historical aspects of the book: the history of its publication, the philological problems etc. This is exactly the type of article one would want for this type of book. In 'Spinoza on Ibn Ezra's "secret of the twelve",' Warren Zev Harvey illuminates a detail in Spinoza's discussion of the authenticity of the Pentateuch. At the end he draws an interesting parallel with Hobbes, which would deserve a closer study. For a critical guide the point is of minor significance.

Daniel Lasker draws attention to the polemical literature against the Christians written by Jews and former conversos, and against the Jews written by Christians ('Reflections of the medieval Jewish-Christian debates in the Theological-Political Treatise and the Epistles'). His general point that Spinoza's rejection of the Jewish faith did not lead him to be completely sympathetic with the Christian faith is valid. His more particular point, that Spinoza's arguments against both the one and the other derive from that polemical literature, may be an overstatement and in any case wants further proof. After all, many of the points held by Spinoza against orthodox Christianity were also made by Socinians and other Christian sects. Moreover, Spinoza's discussion of Christianity is also determined by a political concern, the Christian religion being a source of social and political discord and even civil wars (e.g., in France, the Low Countries, England, Germany). Although therefore Spinoza verbally endorses the Christian religion, he must de-emphasize particular theological points (e.g., Eucharist, Resurrection etc). My impression is that he used whatever arguments could be found.

Among the more original contributions to this volume is the article by Yitzhak Melamed, one of the editors, on 'The metaphysics of the Theological-Political Treatise.' The questions he raises ('what is the metaphysics presented in the TTP and to what extent is it identical with that of the Ethics?') are important. If the TTP does contain a defence of the 'freedom to philosophize', we should know what kind of philosophy is vindicated: any philosophy, Spinoza's own philosophy as a whole, or, as I believe, any philosophy which arrives at conclusions similar to Spinoza's -- more particularly those conclusions most contemporaries saw as 'atheist' or as implying 'atheism.' It seems to me that in the TTP Spinoza is concerned with the practical and religious implications of three of those conclusions: universal determinism, the identity of will and intellect in God, and the conatus. Melamed discusses the first and, rather too briefly, the third point, but surprisingly does not say much about the second point, which to my mind is the most important of all because it implies that God cannot be a lawgiver (which in turn would imply that all religious, moral and political authority is of human origin). Spinoza's argument in ch. 4 of the TTP ('there can be no dissociation between God's will and God's understanding') is identical with that of the Ethics.

Donald Rutherford's contribution to the volume is 'Spinoza's conception of law: metaphysics and ethics'. Spinoza discusses 'law' and particularly 'divine law' in ch. 4 of the TTP, but his argument is hardly straightforward -- usually a sign that the point is both essential and controversial. Indeed, as I already pointed out, if God cannot be a lawgiver, all authority has a human origin and must be explicable by psychological and sociological laws. Moreover, the three monotheist religions would be radically false. It seems to me (and I have argued for it elsewhere) that the idea that there can be no divine lawgiver provides the conceptual link between the various arguments that compose the TTP. Rutherford provides a detailed and clever analysis, trying to reduce the law of God to the 'law of reason', which, according to him, must be a 'law' (in the sense of a binding precept) because reason defines our nature. But, first of all, the divine law as discussed in ch. 4 seems to have as its end the intellectual love of God, and that would mean that Spinoza is concerned, not with reason, but with the intellect (which is not identical with reason). Moreover, in the Political Treatise Spinoza explicitly denies that reason has 'authority' (imperium, TP ii, 20-21), which probably also explains why he usually does not speak of 'the laws of reason' but of the 'lessons of reason' (dictamina rationis) -- prudential rules which, given a certain end, suggest a course of action without containing any obligation. Finally, the notion of human nature (as a normative concept) does not fit easily in Spinoza's general philosophy. Even if my nature would be rational (which according to Spinoza it is not, for that matter, men being primarily passionate beings), I am under no 'natural' obligation to live according to the lessons of reason -- the fool is as 'natural' as the sage (TTP xvi, III, 190). If Spinoza's line were as Rutherford claims, Spinoza would be part of the Grotian tradition of natural law and natural right, which he rejects in TTP (ch. 16) and even more explicitly in TP (ch. 2).

In 'Getting his hands dirty: Spinoza's criticism of the rebel,' Michael Della Rocca moves from a specific question ('to what extent the actions of a rebel can be justified') to one of the fundamental problems of Spinoza's philosophy in general ('to what extent is moral criticism justified'). According to Spinoza the state enhances our power, so a rebellious act, whose end is by definition to destroy the power of the state, would be inherently inconsistent. This argument in turn is based on what Della Rocca calls 'the frying pan'. This is the argument that: 1) 'the more a thing agrees with our nature the more useful it is for us and conversely the more a thing is useful to us the more it agrees with our nature' (Ethics iv, prop. 31, cor); 2) for that reason we should avoid the passions (Ethics iv, prop. 34); and therefore 3) humans agree with each other only in so far as they use reason. Della Rocca concludes that Spinoza disapproves of the rebel without giving himself the metaphysical room to do so -- from the point of view of God the acts of the rebel are necessary events. This is a valid point but even from the point of view of his political logic Spinoza has no means to rebuke the successful rebel. If the rebel can find enough people who believe that he can be successful, the only reason a philosopher can have not to join them is, other things being equal, the fundamental uncertainty of the outcome. But once the rebel proves to be successful, the only thing a philosopher can and must do is to accept the new situation.

That Hobbes plays a significant role in the TTP is clear, but the subject is manifestly intractable, mainly because Spinoza makes a few puzzling remarks on his great contemporary. In '"Promising" ideas: Hobbes and contract in Spinoza's political philosophy,' Don Garrett provides a neat overview of those remarks and discusses them in detail. I am not sure about the way he solves the problem. It seems to me that, although Spinoza allows for the theoretical possibility of a covenant (TTP xvi, III, 193), he finds this notion in fact completely irrelevant because 'nobody makes a contract or is bound to abide by an agreement except through hope of some good or apprehension of some evil' (TTP xvi, III, 196). Spinoza's solution is quite radical in so far as he rests the stability of a commonwealth, not on promises and pledges, which according to Hobbes's third law of nature one would be obliged to respect, but on a dynamic equilibrium between two powers: the sovereign's and the people's. By imposing his will on a population, the sovereign creates a collective force, whose power, that is, whose 'natural right,' by definition surpasses his own. Accordingly, he can maintain his power only as long as he does not frustrate the desires and hopes of his people -- it is in that sense that any commonwealth is a democracy (TTP xvi, III, 193). No contract could alter that situation.

In 'Spinoza's curious defense of toleration,' Justin Steinberg deals with what is arguably one of the key notions in the TTP, given the fact that according to the full title of the TTP Spinoza sets out to show the compatibility of the freedom to philosophize with (and even the indispensability for) piety and peace: 'peace' (pax) being (with harmony: concordia) the seventeenth-century notion (previous to Locke) that comes closest to our idea of toleration (albeit that there are significant differences). According to Steinberg, toleration can be justified on different grounds (epistemic humility, pluralism, natural rights, etc.), but he shows that Spinoza cannot accommodate any of these easily. In fact, there are, according to him, good reasons for ascribing to Spinoza a rather large measure of intolerance, especially in religious matters. His conclusion (different circumstances may allow for different degrees of toleration) is basically right. My only criticism would be that he implies that 'toleration' excludes 'moral legislation.' This is severely misleading because, according to Spinoza, the only 'morality' (as a set of binding rules of behavior) by definition coincides with the positive laws issued by a superior power. Of course, this morality should be distinguished from the doctrine of virtue advocated in Part V of the Ethics. Steinberg's argument would imply for that matter that the toleration advocated in the TTP applies only in the very particular situation of the United Provinces in the second half of the seventeenth century. If a people could share the same religion, it would be perfectly legitimate for their state to be intolerant of any other religion.

In his contribution on 'Miracles, wonder and the state in Spinoza's Theological-Political Treatise,' Michael Rosenthal, one of the editors, addresses the problem of collective action, more particularly that by which people come to call into being a state and to accept sovereign rule. He rightly concludes that this cannot be by means of a contract because that presupposes conditions of rationality which would make the state superfluous -- an excellent point. Instead he introduces the psychological category of wonder (admiratio), a feeling he associates with miracles and, in politics, with the free will of a sovereign, this being something like a 'miracle' in so far as a free will is physically and metaphysically impossible. I do not think that solution works. For most people the freedom of the will is not a miracle but an explanatory concept, something by which one explains a thing or event which otherwise would cause wonder. Moreover, the free will of the sovereign cannot be an object of wonder for those who ascribe the same freedom of the will to themselves; it is not the freedom of the sovereign's will that impresses them but its force. So even if it is admitted that wonder intervenes at some level, it would rather be in the form of awe.

Perhaps the most interesting article in this volume is by Susan James, who also comes closest to providing a key for a more general understanding of the TTP. James, who since the publication of this volume published her own overall interpretation of the TTP (Spinoza on Philosophy, Religion and Politics: The Theologico-Political Treatise, Oxford University Press, 2012), implicitly identifies the imagination as one of the underlying themes that link the various arguments of the TTP. According to her, Spinoza adopts basically two ways to achieve the good life: philosophy, which explains the world and man living in it, and the imagination, which provides a narrative account of the world that serves as a guide for acting and thinking. The majority of people, however, are exclusively led by the imagination. Motivated by their imaginations (and the passions associated with them), they form a picture of the world, themselves and their history, in terms of images and narratives. These can unite a certain community, in so far as narratives can be shared (a religion, a founding myth), but they can also divide because they lack the certainty of a philosophical theory and, given the fact that they are always interpreted from a personal history, are essentially volatile. As a result, the unity of a community or a nation is always more or less precarious, even though inevitably any community must depend on a narrative that binds. The implication seems to be that the TTP contains the search for such a narrative. Accordingly, James would situate the TTP in the very particular context of Dutch society, a society that was deeply divided -- religiously, intellectually, politically; a society that was also desperately in need of a more inclusive narrative. I think this is a very promising approach, which moreover would provide the TTP with an unexpected actuality.

Again, despite all the criticism one can have with regard to particular points, the level of scholarship in this volume is exceptionally high. Still, apart from the fact that the book is hardly a 'guide' in the proper sense of that word, the overall result is a bit disappointing insofar as it does not really result in an agenda of further research. After reading the volume we still do not know what problem we should address next and how.

[1] All references are to the Gebhardt edition.