Spinoza's Authority Volume I: Resistance and Power in Ethics & Spinoza's Authority Volume II: Resistance and Power in the Political Treatises

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A. Kiarina Kordela and Dimitris Vardoulakis (eds.), Spinoza's Authority Volume I: Resistance and Power in Ethics, Bloomsbury, 2018, 222 pp., $114.00, ISBN9781472593221. 

A. Kiarina Kordela and Dimitris Vardoulakis (eds.), Spinoza's Authority Volume II: Resistance and Power in the Political Treatises, Bloomsbury, 2018, 197 pp., $114.00, ISBN 9781350011069.

Reviewed by Michael LeBuffe, University of Otago


These volumes in Bloomsbury's series of studies in continental philosophy arise from the editors' and authors' conviction that a study of Spinoza's views about authority can be productive politically. The volumes include works of scholarship, then, but scholarship with a purpose beyond that of understanding Spinoza. The editors and authors take Spinoza to have enduring relevance for the criticism of and resistance to harmful power structures in society today. The essays ought to be read as works themselves on political philosophy and critical theory as well as works on Spinoza.

Volume I focuses on political aspects of Spinoza's Ethics. Explicitly political content in the Ethics is scarce. It is limited, on a narrow view of the political, to discussions of social contract and related notions at 4pp36-37 (Ethics, Part 4, propositions 36 to 37) and their scholia; Spinoza's account of the social function of traditional virtues at 4p54s, which follows a formal argument that humility is not in fact a virtue with a qualified recommendation of humility, repentance, and reverence for "the crowd"; accounts of the free man's behavior in society at 4p69, 4p70, and 4p73; and entries in the Appendix to Part 4 correlate to these passages. Authors in Volume I find, however, foundational political concepts in Spinoza's uses of potestas and potentia and tend to use these terms, following Gilles Deleuze (Expression in Philosophy, Chapter 14) or Antonio Negri (The Savage Anomaly, Preface), to refer, on the one hand, to a capacity, ability, or power to do what one is not at present doing and, on the other hand, an ongoing causal activity or exercise of power. (Accounts of these terms vary across authors in these volumes, however, and this distinction captures only very roughly and imperfectly the complex, difficult views of Deleuze and Negri.) Because this tradition tends to identify potestas with authority, it can find a great deal of material in the Ethics to hold political interest. This last identification, I should note, is explicitly evident in Spinoza's political writings: whatever else potestas means for Spinoza, he consistently uses the term in political contexts to refer to the sovereign power in a state. Understood as a political term -- and this is something more of an interpretative leap -- potentia, because it is the ongoing causal activity of a thing, can be a basis in Spinoza's thought for realism in political theory. Authors in this volume emphasize Spinoza's uses of these terms as well as explicitly political passages in the Ethics.

Dimitris Vardoulakis' ambitious "Equality and Power" is an attempt to understand Spinoza's claim at 4p36 that the greatest good can be enjoyed by all equally. Vardoulakis argues that Spinoza offers us a distinctive account of human equality. Each of us is badly, and unequally, limited because, by 4a1, any of us can be overpowered. Nevertheless, from this status we find "an equality in the participation and engagement of contestation" (16). To my mind, this sort of equality is reminiscent of Hobbes's view of equality: we may be unequal in strength, but we remain equal in the politically important sense that any of us can be killed by the others. Hobbes's account is a feature of the state of nature, however. Vardoulakis finds a reason in the ongoing engagement of subjects in a state to distinguish Spinoza's account of equality sharply from that of Hobbes and other figures.

Aurelia Armstrong, in "Spinoza's Ethics and Politics of Freedom," defends a social conception of the route to freedom that Spinoza describes. It is easy, emphasizing the elitism in the Ethics and the language that focuses on the increasing power of a single human mind, to take perfection to be the private goal of a sage in isolation. In an admirably clear argument, which emphasizes the free man propositions of Part 4, Armstrong shows that state and society are essential to the project primarily because civil laws make behavior in accordance with reason habitual, a first and critical step to action from reason.

In "Grammars of Conatus," Cesare Casarino builds a detailed account of conatus, the striving that characterizes each individual in Spinoza's metaphysics. To emphasize only part of this detailed essay, which works from Deleuze's emphasis on resistance, Casarino takes conatus to have aspects involving both potestas and potentia. Insofar as it involves potestas, he argues, conatus amounts to force expressed as power. Insofar as it involves potentia, conatus amounts to resistance. An especially interesting feature of this essay is Casarino's identification of this distinction with the distinction between the essence and existence of singular things, a point that is clearest in the essay's conclusion (80).

Juan Domingo Sánchez Estop argues in "Beyond Legitimacy" that Spinoza's account of authority places him in the tradition of Machiavelli and Marx rather than that of Hobbes, Hegel, Locke, and Rousseau. Authority, he argues, is not the basis for legitimate potestas; rather it arises from the exercise of potestas. Why "the exercise of potestas" rather than potentia, which usually marks expression or activity? I suspect that Sánchez Estop has a good answer to this question: just as potestas in the possession is authority, the imaginative perception of potestas is subjection or obedience. People are not made subjects through the active exercise of power (alone, at least) but through the imaginative positing of an authority. If this is right -- and I am not sure that it I follow Sánchez Estop here -- then Spinoza does seem to anticipate many themes in Marx. Still, this very engaging paper could benefit from some discussion of potentia, which one might well identify with Machiavellian and Marxist emphases on genuine material causes of political structures.

Negri's own entry, "Spinoza: A Different Power to Act," revisits the distinction between potentia and potestas. Negri offers a nuanced and detailed, but difficult to follow, account of the relation. He also resists the easy distinction between the two with which this review and, to my eyes, his The Savage Anomaly begins, defending instead an interpretation on which there is some kind of "continuously produced struggle" between the two. It is a difficult essay, but it may be a valuable resource for scholars working to build an interpretation of Spinoza on the basis of the terms. Negri's conclusion, moreover, contributes a great deal to the volume's aim to emphasize the relevance of the author's ideas for an understanding and critique of society.

In "Spinoza's Biopolitics," A. Kiarina Kordela combines careful and detailed discussion of Spinoza's Theological Political Treatise (hereafter, TTP) and theories of knowledge and eternity in the Ethics with a broader argument that Spinoza's conception of the power of acting of an individual human being as a "singular expression of substance" (208) is the same as Marx's conception of labor-power. This view is nicely compatible with the familiar conviction, in this school of thought, that potentia in Spinoza is a political concept and yields a specific, accessible version of that conviction. Kordela's view -- the identification of the power of individuals, which is their essence and the object of that intuitive knowledge which would be the best kind of self-knowledge, with labor-power -- is fruitful, moreover, insofar as it allows her to find in Spinoza's account of intuitive knowledge a kind of political self-awareness and, in the imaginative view that that the mind is immortal, a dangerous kind of political illusion.

Several of the articles in Volume I move outside the central theme of power to other political themes of the Ethics. Joe Hughes's "The Cold Quietness of the Stars" responds to Alain Badiou's characterization of Spinoza's geometrical method. Badiou, in a manner strongly reminiscent of the long scholium that ends Ethics 2, has taken the political lesson of Spinoza's method to be an understanding of how to act in the knowledge of universal necessity. Hughes reconceives the method of the Ethics as itself a kind of creative activity and a political activity distinct from the imaginative activity, which is also political, that characterizes religion.

Warren Montag argues in "Commanding the Body" that the legalistic language of Ethics 3p2s suggests that Spinoza's criticism there of two common views -- the view that the mind controls the body and the important related view that the mind is free -- are criticisms of the common political conceptions of control and freedom as well. There is little doubt that Spinoza's views about the mind-body relation have some implications for politics. I find this essay misleading, however, insofar as it suggests (147-148) that important terms with political connotations, iuris and praejudicia, may be found in 3p2s. Imperium is present, where Spinoza discusses the view that the mind commands the body, but these other terms are not. The essay, which offers a number of valuable historical generalizations about these and other Latin terms, therefore gets off to a shaky start.

"Interrupting the System: Spinoza and Maroon Thought" is James Edward Ford III's response to a passage in a letter to Pieter Balling of 20 July 1664, in which Spinoza reports a dream of a black and scabby Brazilian (nigri, & scabiosi Brasiliani). Negri has suggested in The Savage Anomaly that the figure is Caliban. In an interrogation that asks less who Spinoza meant to invoke than what his invocation means, Ford argues that the Maroon, because of the communal rather than solitary nature of the Maroons, is a more productive identity for Spinoza's Brazilian. The suggestion is a good one, given the prominence of Portuguese and Dutch slavery in Spinoza's cultural surroundings, and Ford uses the insight to good effect, especially in discussing the challenges that racial complexity poses for Spinoza's views about power-sharing (191).

Ford's essay does raise the concern for me that a passage that at least seems on the face of it to be simply an uninteresting, depressingly typical, and wrongful expression of racist fear might be read ultimately as an expression of sympathy. In places (179-180) Ford seems to suggest as much, namely, that Spinoza's persistent dream of a scabby black man is really the dream of someone who is like Spinoza, and that the dream really expresses an opposition to slavery. I am sorry to say that I think that the first, depressingly typical, reading is more probable. Still Ford's engaging essay offers a great deal of interesting discussion of Caliban and Maroons and what a Spinozist today -- if not Spinoza himself -- might productively say about race, colonialism, and society.

Volume II of Spinoza's Authority focuses on Spinoza's explicitly political texts and primarily on the TTP. The essays collected may be divided roughly into three groups: three chapters concern Machiavellian themes in Spinoza; four consider Spinoza's conception of interpretation, and especially scriptural interpretation; and one, the work of Chiara Bottici and Miguel de Beistegui that closes the study, offers an account of obedience.

Vittorio Morfino finds three Machiavellian themes in the TTP: he takes Machiavelli's account of the importance of fortune to influence Spinoza's account of the Hebrew Nation; he takes fortune to be manifest, in particular, in the chance preservation and transmission of memory in society; and he takes Spinoza's accounts of authority to owe a debt to the accounts of conflict in Machiavelli's Discourses. Of these, the discussion of fortune is the most compelling and intriguing. Fortune is undoubtedly a central theme of the TTP, and Morfino offers many useful insights into Spinoza's treatment of fortune.

However, I have two reservations about the use of Machiavelli here. The first is that fortune is a theme in a great number of classical authors and a central figure of Roman culture. These authors include, for example, Quintus Curtius and Tacitus, who are sources for Spinoza in the TTP and Machiavelli alike. Spinoza undoubtedly has Machiavelli in view in many passages in the TTP, and he discusses Machiavelli by name in the Political Treatise (TP). With respect to a theme as common in and important to Roman writing as fortune, however, readers need some explicit argument showing that there is a deep connection here between Machiavelli's conception of fortune in particular and Spinoza's account of fortune. The second is that Spinoza offers an account of fortune at TTP 3 that is consistent with universal necessity: we will call fortune what is beyond our knowledge. Machiavelli makes fortune responsible for half of what befalls us (in The Prince, Chapter 25, a passage the Morfino quotes), leaving free will responsible for the other half. Morfino sets aside this apparent divide between the philosophers by asserting that Machiavelli means by this invocation of free will nothing more than "the necessary inclination of the agent" (10). More than mere assertion is necessary here, however, especially given the first concern. The long history of invocations of fortune in the literature that Spinoza draws upon in the TTP may well include accounts of fortune that Spinoza found more congenial than that of The Prince.

Filippo Del Lucchese, drawing upon Morfino as well as Hannah Arendt and Laurent Bove, argues that the relationship between law and conflict in Spinoza may be understood in the same way as the relationship between mind and body: law is the idea of conflict. The thesis draws to some extent upon a univocal reading of natural and civil law: if, according to natural law, we human individuals are always in conflict, then, in a way, natural laws describe, or are of conflict. I have trouble, however, in seeing how the thesis applies to civil laws. Luccese's response to such difficulty, generally, is to invoke Spinoza's identification of right and power, which, on the view of this essay, tends to undermine any kind of strong distinction between what we ought to do and what we in fact do.

In "Authority and the Law," Vardoulakis attempts to show how Spinoza can produce a conception of authority that leads to a democratic politics. Developing a detailed account of Adam and the fall, he takes Spinoza to found a conception of law on an understanding of Adam's disobedience, making authority and law the result of a misunderstanding or misrepresentation of divine law (62). Authority, on such a shaky basis, is always subject to criticism. Vardoulakis's detailed account of Adam is useful and engaging. Although he does mention the late chapters of the TTP at the end of his essay, a reading of Spinoza's apparently very sharp constraints on freedom of religion and, in particular, his placement of control of religion under the power of states would have been a welcome addition. Spinoza does at least seem to maintain that the state's authority in some questions is beyond dispute, and that feature of the TTP stands in apparent tension with Vardoulakis's conclusion that, for Spinoza, all authority is, by its origin, properly subject to criticism.

Turning now to the essays that focus on questions of interpretation, James R. Martel's excellent, provocative essay on Hobbes, Spinoza, and scriptural interpretation is an argument that Hobbes, more than Spinoza, permits and even encourages a variety of interpretations of scripture. Hobbes on this account acknowledges the metaphorical nature of much of scripture and the variety of interpretations that can result. In insisting that some readings are dangerous and idolatrous, Martel argues, Hobbes does not thereby rule out a variety of acceptable readings (72-73): we can have no knowledge of God at all, so there is no basis to privilege some readings over others. One might object to this view that a central function of the sovereign on Hobbes's account is to supply a single authorized interpretation of scripture. Martel appreciates this tension and dedicates a section to unraveling it. He argues that for Hobbes ultimately even sovereign interpretations depend upon "ordinary discourses of language" (76).

Spinoza is more conservative, on Martel's account, because reason in Spinoza permits some knowledge of God: there is in some sense a correct religious view which will resonate to some extent with the philosopher's knowledge of God. There is a basis in Spinoza, then, where there is not for Hobbes, for hoping the state's law can really be God's law (80).

The view, which is well-presented and fascinating, raises difficult questions. I have two principal concerns. The first is Martel's quick transitions among texts. For Hobbes, it seems to me on the face of it that De Cive is a much less secular text than Leviathan and that Behemoth is tailored more to particular historical circumstance than either of the others. A particularly pressing version of this problem arises for Martel's account of reason in Hobbes: De Cive clearly has a much stronger conception of right reason than anything that Martel attributes to Hobbes and anything that might plausibly be attributed to Leviathan. In Leviathan, right reason is elusive, and it is the right source for Martel; why, though, should Martel rely upon De Cive for some conclusions about Hobbes but not rely upon it for a stronger conception of right reason? Similarly, for Spinoza, doctrinal questions about the relation between the Ethics, where the philosophical knowledge of God is mainly to be found, and the TTP are pressing. My second concern is a question about norms and interpretation in Hobbes. Martel demonstrates that Hobbes takes the variety of scriptural interpretations to be a fact, and he offers at least very persuasive claims about the source of any sovereign interpretation in the readings of ordinary people. Neither of these points show, however, that Hobbes takes a variety of readings of scripture to be acceptable or desirable within a single state.

Supposing that he is correct about the authors' views, perhaps Martel's contention that Hobbes is more tolerant of a variety of readings than Spinoza in virtue of his very thin conception of reason may still be turned on its head. In arguing that there is a source of knowledge in reason, Spinoza at the same time argues that everybody (indeed all things!) have reason. That gives Spinoza a basis for arguing that a person might well resist a sovereign who insisted that religion requires something different from the tenets of universal faith. By contrast, where reason is only a faculty of adding and not a source of original knowledge, as it is in the first two part of Leviathan, there is not the same sort of basis for asserting that a sovereign's authorized interpretations of scripture are against reason. Suppose that Hobbes rejects any view on which readers can know that they understand scripture correctly and that he insists that, for the sake of peace, some one interpretation must nevertheless be held as right by all. The Spinozistic basis for criticizing the sovereign interpretation, which depends upon the ordinary person's knowledge of some religious truths, will not arise for Hobbes so understood.

Siarhei Biareishyk examines the importance of Spinoza's account of error for his views about interpretation. He defends a highly original account of three varieties of error corresponding to the three kinds of knowledge (that is, of cognitio). On this view, causal attribution errors correspond to imaginative knowledge; error in the formation of universal notions corresponds to knowledge by reason; political error, which undermines the sovereign authority to interpret scripture, also undermines "the very essence of singular sovereignty" (109) and corresponds therefore to knowledge of the third kind, knowledge of the essences of singular things. Biareishyk argues that the TTP both explains and commits this last kind of error.

Kordela and Joseph Bermas-Dawes, in "Spinoza's Immanent Sovereignty," argue that on Spinoza's account the fact that power and right remains with citizens in a state is in tension with the claim that the sovereign has the authority to interpret. The essay features significant engagement with the TP and its Chapter 4 account of authority. The authors develop in response to their initial question an account of political authority that makes it largely imaginative and therefore independent of metaphysical truths. The response explains, without justifying, subjects' attribution of authority to the sovereign.

Gregg Lambert's "Spinoza and Signs," which focuses on TTP 17, offers another account of the importance of imagination and error to authority. Lambert focuses on the relation between Spinoza's views about interpretation and imagination and on his resistance to the project of utopian political theory. As Lambert presents Spinoza's view, the structure of laws in any society is contingent, and structures vary with the particular circumstances and origins of states. The thesis explains nicely the strongly realist opening of the TP.

The volume's final essay stands apart from the others thematically. Bottici and Beistegui pose a puzzle about obedience in Spinoza: why do people fight for servitude? The authors offer detailed discussions of destructive superstition in the TTP and of the project that stable governments have of organizing, containing, and channeling the flow of human affects through the imagination (168). The essay relies heavily on Spinoza's theory of the affects, which has its source principally in the Ethics, so it raises the question of doctrinal continuity between Spinoza's works, a pressing issue. The essay also features several sections relating Spinoza, once more, to contemporary social and political issues.

The two volumes of Spinoza's Authority have a great deal to offer students and working scholars alike. They contribute to the continental tradition of the interpretation of Spinoza, and they also describe Spinozism as an approach to current social and political issues.