Spinoza's Ethics: A Critical Guide

Placeholder book cover

Yitzhak Melamed (ed.), Spinoza's Ethics: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 346pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107118119.

Reviewed by Matthew Kisner, University of South Carolina


The fifteen essays in this Critical Guide aim to contribute to the latest research on Spinoza's Ethics. Rather than focusing on a particular theme, the volume provides balanced coverage of the standard topics (metaphysics, knowledge, emotions, ethics), without falling prey to the common tendency to focus on the first two parts of the Ethics. Consequently, most Spinoza scholars will find something in the volume to be essential reading; the same is likely true for many historians of early modern philosophy generally. The editor has included many international scholars, with contributions from Warren Zev Harvey (Israel), Lia Levy (Brazil), Beth Lord (the United Kingdom), and Pina Totaro (Italy). Nevertheless, the essays are mostly the sort of thing that one expects from Anglophone, particularly North American Spinoza scholarship: the primary focus is analyzing Spinoza's philosophy using the conceptual resources of Anglophone, analytic philosophy; the essays generally look to this tradition to identify and frame the important questions.

With so many essays distributed across so many topics, it is necessary that I devote my attention selectively. My choice of discussion topics is inevitably shaped by my own areas of expertise and my idiosyncratic interests. The reader should not take these choices as a comment on the quality of the other contributions.

Don Garrett deals with a basic and familiar problem in the Ethics: on one hand, Spinoza asserts that minds and bodies are identical; on the other hand, he also claims that they possess completely different properties (thought and extension). This appears to violate a principle that many of Spinoza's readers regard as obviously true, the indiscernibility of identicals: if x and y are the same individual thing, then they possess the same properties. While others address the problem by explaining how Spinoza can avoid violating the principle, Garrett proposes that Spinoza rejects the indiscernibility of identicals, or, at least, that Spinoza only accepts the principle under certain conditions. John Morrison also concludes that Spinoza rejects the indiscernibility of identicals. Morrison shows that this conclusion solves other problems, for instance, explaining how a mind can be identical to the idea of the mind, even though they represent different things: the mind represents the body, whereas the idea of the mind represents the mind. But Garrett goes even further: he also argues that Spinoza does not accept the principle of the transitivity of identity, which is similarly difficult to square with Spinoza's claims that the attributes are different from one another, yet also identical to the one substance.

But what would motivate Spinoza to reject a principle that many readers have considered to be self-evident? Garrett cites two motives. The first is strong ontological pluralism, which Garrett takes to imply that there are different ways of being (as thought and as extension), rather than merely different beings. If an individual can exist in different ways, then it must have different properties. Interestingly, Garrett sees this commitment as Spinoza's development of Descartes' view that formal and objective reality are two different modes of being. The second motive is the adequate-ideas conception of truth, that is, the view that all and only adequate ideas are true. According to this view, truth is not merely a matter of correspondence between ideas and things, but also requires that ideas represent things completely, as adequate ideas do. It follows that true ideas must understand things through their peculiar way of being: bodies must be understood through extension, and ideas through thought. Consequently, we can never truly conceive of a body as thinking or of a mind as extended. Since the indiscernibility of identicals would imply precisely such a conclusion, the adequate ideas conception of truth provides reason to reject it.

It is interesting that Garrett's view opposes a fascinating contribution from Kristin Primus, though this difference is not discussed in the volume. Primus's piece takes up two difficult questions about scientia intuitiva, Spinoza's third kind of knowledge. First, what is so special about intuitive knowledge that makes it superior to reason, as Spinoza frequently asserts? The second question receives far less fanfare in the piece, though it is every bit as important: how is the third kind of knowledge supposed to be attainable, given that it involves knowledge of the essences of particular things? One worry is that such knowledge would require knowing all of the infinite causes of particular things, which seems impossible. Another worry is that it isn't clear how knowledge of God's very general essence leads to knowledge of a specific, particular essence.

Primus's answer to the second question rests on an innovative reading of Spinoza's claim that the third kind of knowledge concerns "the essences of things." As it is traditionally read, Spinoza is claiming that intuition knows the individual essences of things (the essence of this mind, or of this body). Primus suggests reading this (more plausibly, in my opinion) as referring to the essences of things plural, that is, the essences of all these things generally, but not of the particular individuals: the essences of minds and bodies, but not the essences of this individual mind, this individual body. Read in this way, the third kind of knowledge is not particular and, consequently, there is no problem in explaining how such knowledge is attainable. It is worth noting that this solution stands independently of Primus's other, more controversial, claims.

The controversial claims are connected to Primus's answer to the first question. According to Primus, reason only provides us with knowledge of common or universal properties of things, which does not directly show us that these ideas agree with formally real, actually existing things. To know this, one would have to use reasoning based on these universal properties to demonstrate that all of our adequate representations must be true. While reason can provide us with this knowledge, it requires additional steps; one does not see directly in the cognition of the things themselves that they exist as we represent them. In contrast, intuitive knowledge sees the essences (plural) of things as following directly from God's essence. Consequently, intuitive knowledge is special because it recognizes directly and in a single perception that our adequate ideas are true. This reading makes Spinoza's scientia look a lot like Descartes': it attains a greater degree of certainty because it involves knowledge of God. But this reading is likely controversial. Firstly, contrary to Garrett, it supposes that adequate ideas of reason are not necessarily true (or perhaps that we do not necessarily know that they are true, which one would have to reconcile with 2p43, where Spinoza claims that we necessarily know that our true ideas are true).[1] Furthermore, it supposes that ideas of the common properties of things do not include the idea of God's essence, which one would have to reconcile with 2p46d, where Spinoza appears to say otherwise.

Alison Peterman shows that the so-called "physical digression" following 2p13 is neither physical nor a digression. In contrast to Tschirnhaus's influential reading (which he pressed in his correspondence with Spinoza), Peterman shows that this section of the text is not physical, in the sense that it is not a considered attempt to provide a physical theory. For instance, the text does not seriously consider the nature of matter in motion and its laws. The chapter also shows that this section is not a digression but is tightly integrated into the sequence of arguments of Part 2. The section follows immediately on Spinoza's important conclusion that the object of the idea constituting the mind is an actually existing body, which prompts him to say something about the nature of the body. In doing so, Spinoza's main concern, Peterman argues, is to account for individuation and identity, which he does in a way that is largely attribute neutral, rather than mired in a physical theory. I did sometimes struggle to follow the thread of Peterman's narrative and how it fits into the bigger picture, but her close reading of Spinoza's text is full of insights that make it well worth the effort.

Harvey argues that Spinoza's criticisms of anthropomorphism and teleology in 1appendix are likely indebted to Maimonides. Harvey's insightful observations on the parallels between Spinoza and Maimonides provide good reason to regard Maimonides as essential background to Spinoza's view of teleology, which adds an important dimension to our understanding of the subject. Harvey also compares the philosophers' views on the subject, concluding that Spinoza's criticisms are stronger and less equivocal than Maimonides'. This comparison is predicated on the notion that Spinoza aims to eliminate teleology entirely, a notion which is contested, more so than Harvey acknowledges.

John Carriero discusses Spinoza's theory of conatus. Rather than focusing foremost on difficulties with the theory, Carriero aims to provide a general interpretation. Central to this interpretation is Spinoza's effort to identify and differentiate finite individuals and their essences, given his plenum physics. Carriero argues that once Spinoza's theory of conatus is properly conceived, we can see more clearly how it departs from the Aristotelian tradition and how it provides responses to the usual criticisms. While the piece is not always explicit about precisely how Carriero's reading departs from or improves upon standard readings of the conatus theory, one point in particular stood out for me. Carriero denies that everything we ordinarily understand as an individual meets Spinoza's definition of an individual. Consequently, it is not the case that everything we ordinarily regard as an individual possesses an essence or a striving. This conclusion opens the possibility that candles and bombs are not individuals with strivings, which provides a straightforward reason to deny that these are counterexamples to Spinoza's theory of conatus, as is commonly supposed.

Melamed investigates Spinoza's rejection of free will and his explanation of the reasons that force us to believe in free will. The inspiration for this chapter is partly Fichte's criticism that Spinoza could not have believed his own philosophy because people necessarily conceive of themselves as having free will. Melamed ultimately endorses Fichte's view that, for Spinoza, humans inevitably conceive of themselves as possessing free will. It is a persistent error that we are stuck with, even though we may recognize it as mistaken, much like our perception that the sun is closer than it really is. Along the way, the chapter addresses a number of other interesting questions: would the belief in free will be shared by non-humans, rocks even? In what sense is this belief innate?

I do have one quibble with this chapter. It seems that Spinoza criticizes the notion of free will at least partly because it misunderstands the notion of freedom; for instance, Spinoza criticizes his opponent's "idea of freedom" (2p35s). It is not hard to see why Spinoza would pursue this line of criticism. People usually conceive of the will as free in the sense that it is either a spontaneous power (an ability to act independently of prior determination) or a special modal power (the ability to realize different possible courses of action, such as acting or not acting). Both notions of freedom are ruled out by Spinoza's view that all things are necessarily determined. Spinoza instead conceives of freedom in a way that is consistent with necessary determination. But Melamed's survey of Spinoza's reasons for rejecting free will do not explicitly name this basic disagreement about the nature of freedom itself.

I mention this point because I think it provides Spinoza with a more robust avenue for responding to Fichte's criticism. The starting point of Fichte's Wissenschaftslehre is the conflict between two kinds of philosophy: dogmatism, which implies a strict form of determinism, and idealism, which asserts the reality and experience of human freedom. Fichte's criticism is not just that Spinoza cannot escape a conception of oneself as possessing free will, but moreover that Spinoza is a dogmatist and, consequently, that he rules out the possibility of what Fichte regards as the true and meaningful conception of freedom: spontaneity, a lack of prior determination. But Spinoza's rejection of free will includes a rejection of Fichte's very notion of freedom and supplants it with a conception of freedom that is compatible with causal determination. Thus, Spinoza offers a potential escape route from Fichte's dilemma and an answer to Fichte's criticism.

Colin Marshall makes significant advances in the recent debate about whether Spinoza should be described as a 'moral realist'. Marshall draws on work in contemporary metaethics to survey several reasons for classifying Spinoza as a moral realist or anti-realist. I am hopeful that this work will make it harder for commentators to blithely assume that Spinoza was obviously an anti-realist without at least recognizing the significant challenges posed by the opposing evidence and arguments. Until now, the controversy in the literature has focused on the question of whether Spinoza regards good and bad as real, whereas Marshall shows that other aspects of Spinoza's ethical theory, such as his account of reason's dictates or his theory of virtue, could qualify as realist (or anti-realist), entirely independently of Spinoza's view of good and bad. Marshall also moves the debate forward by offering an entirely new argument for classifying Spinoza as a moral realist. He argues that Spinoza's God functions like Plato's form of the good in that both are the source of all things, the knowledge of which provides us with moral standards. I have a hard time seeing my way to the argument's conclusion because of the considerable differences between Spinoza's immanent God and Plato's transcendent form of the good. But it is certainly an argument worth considering, and one that enlarges our understanding of the issues involved in the debate.

Samuel Newlands takes up a related question about Spinoza's view on the reality of perfection. In the preface to Part 4, Spinoza claims that good and bad are nothing more than modes of thinking, which has provided much of the reason for reading Spinoza as defending a kind of moral anti-realism. In the same text, Spinoza makes parallel claims about perfection, which strongly suggests that perfection is not real but just an abstraction that exists only in our thoughts. However, Newlands argues that Spinoza does regard perfection as real. Newlands ultimately distinguishes two notions of perfection: (1) normative or moral perfection, which is not real and is judged in terms of what is pleasing and desirable to humans, and (2) metaphysical perfection, which is non-normative, non-moral and is judged from the nature and structure of things themselves. I do wonder how sharp the distinction is when judging human perfection, since our nature is our striving, which is identical to our desires and emotions -- joy and sorrow are transitions in our power of acting or the strength of our striving. Consequently, our metaphysical perfection includes the emotional states and attitudes that we use to make normative and moral judgments, including normative and moral judgments of perfection. In the second part of the chapter, Newlands provides a fascinating and innovative reading of Spinoza's view of metaphysical perfection as involving both ontological plenitude and parsimony. The result is that Spinozistic perfection ends up looking a lot like Leibnizian harmony. This reading allows Newlands to bring Spinoza into a surprising dialogue with both Leibniz and Jonathan Schaffer.

Lisa Shapiro provides a close reading of propositions 3p12 through 3p24, where Spinoza explains the psychological mechanisms and principles by which our ideas become associated with one another in our experiences and by which we associate objects in our thoughts. I was particularly interested in Shapiro's helpful discussion of attention, a concept that Spinoza implicitly relies on, but does not explicitly theorize.

Lord surveys Spinoza's apparently disparate claims about money and commerce to piece together his view on the ethics of economic exchange. She also considers how this view speaks to common views of the time in the Dutch republic. While Lord concludes that many of Spinoza's views on these matters were commonplace, she also points to glimmers of a more radical proposal for a more rational approach to commerce that results in an economy that is more equal and naturally beneficial to all. While Lord doesn't emphasize this point, her chapter provides an important piece of the puzzle for commentators interested in relating Spinoza's philosophy to materialism or Marxism.

In the final chapter, Michael LeBuffe examines Spinoza's commitment to the importance of reason for combatting harmful passions, reordering our thought processes and directing our actions. Focusing on 5p7, LeBuffe notes that reason has this importance largely because ideas of reason represent objects as always present, which gives these ideas special psychological power. LeBuffe argues that inadequate ideas could have precisely the same power, which makes it possible for inadequate ideas to play an instrumental role in helping us to achieve Spinoza's ethical aims, such as diminishing the influence of harmful passions. Although LeBuffe does not make this point, these conclusions buttress a great deal of work arguing that Spinoza sees a positive moral (or perhaps even epistemic) value for inadequate ideas and imagination.

In addition to these chapters, Martin Lin's contribution aims to determine Spinoza's view on the mark of the mental. Among other things, he argues that it is challenging for Spinoza to provide such a mark because of the symmetry among the attributes. Levy examines Spinoza's notion of 'causa conscientiae' to determine what it can tell us about Spinoza's view of consciousness and his differences from Descartes. Totaro examines how Spinoza's terms for certain emotions change with the progress of the Ethics to reflect differences in the way that these emotions are conceived through the three kinds of knowledge.

In summary, this well curated volume provides significant new contributions to the latest research, touching on a wide-variety of topics in Spinoza's Ethics.

[1] Spinoza’s Ethics is cited by part and proposition, as is standard; d = demonstration.