Spinoza's Political Psychology: The Taming of Fortune and Fear

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Justin Steinberg, Spinoza's Political Psychology: The Taming of Fortune and Fear, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 235pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107141308.

Reviewed by Michael LeBuffe, University of Otago


This ambitious, successful book presents an interpretation of Spinoza's views on politics as they occur, principally, in the Ethics, the Theological-Political Treatise (TTP) and the Political Treatise (TP). Among recent books on Spinoza, Justin Steinberg's is notable for taking as its topic Spinoza's politics in general, rather than some particular work. It is also notable for the breadth of Steinberg's scholarship. Steinberg frequently refers to works that influenced Spinoza; to relevant historical events; to a broad range of scholarship on Spinoza in English and French; and to contemporary philosophy and political theory. This breadth enriches the book's argument and promises to make the work accessible and engaging for many different sorts of readers.

Steinberg emphasizes Spinoza's claim, from the opening of the TP, that his politics is an attempt to build a theory for human beings as they are rather than as one might want them to be (6-7). This position explains and justifies Steinberg's attention to Spinoza's psychology. It also serves as an initial reason to take Spinoza's works to present a single body of argument. The Ethics offers, after all, a finely detailed account of what human beings are like, and the TP in particular draws directly upon that account. Paragraph 1.5 of the TP, where Spinoza refers repeatedly to the psychology of the Ethics, is strong evidence of this. The TTP is a tougher case, which I address in several places below. Despite some bumps, I think that Steinberg succeeds in Chapter 7 at showing readers how the TTP and TP fit together.

A concept central to Steinberg's arguments is ingenium. Very roughly -- and this is my language -- an ingenium for Spinoza is a set of affective dispositions that amounts to a person's character. To take human beings as they are is to understand their ingenia and the ways in which political structures and interactions shape them. There are for Spinoza, certainly, a great variety of ways that a human being might be, a variety that is limited only by the number of different affects and of different objects that might associate with each affect. An individual's present circumstances determine which affects (that is, desires and emotions) characterize the person now and, therefore, whether and how he or she might come to be moved by different affects. The state, of course, is prominent among those circumstances.

Steinberg maintains -- and this seems to me to be clearly correct -- that Spinoza conceives of the state as a means to improve citizens. If Spinoza does not take human beings as he wants them to be, he nevertheless makes it an aim of the state to make them what he wants them to be. Spinoza's political realism -- set against the background theory of ingenium -- amounts then to an effort to understand how different kinds of present circumstances shape citizens and how, in each kind of circumstances, states can make it possible for citizens to become better. Steinberg argues that Spinoza consistently, albeit contingently, takes more democratic states to better serve their citizens in this sense.

The book is well-structured. Each chapter defends or expands upon this basic view by means of a clear thesis and largely self-standing argument. Where Steinberg draws upon results of previous chapters, he helpfully refers back to the relevant discussions. A summary account of each chapter follows. I incorporate critical remarks into the summary.

Chapter 1 is the defense of an interpretation of Spinoza's views about ingenium with particular attention to politics. Its central claims are that, for Spinoza, the activity of finite things is fixed by their affects and that socio-political structures influence the ingenia of the human beings who live in them. Each of these claims is well defended. Many details of Spinoza's psychology remain controversial. I find two interpretative claims of this chapter particularly striking, and I would like to read more about the reasons that Steinberg has for maintaining them.

First, Steinberg contends that, for Spinoza, "one who does not desire x more than y does not really judge x to be better than y" (22). If Steinberg is correct, then Spinoza's oft-repeated claim that although I see the better I do the worse must be taken at something other than face value. To my mind, although it may be true, for Spinoza, that I judge x to be better than y whenever I desire x more than y, it does not follow from this that I do not also judge y to be better than x. After all, Spinoza does maintain that I can have two different ideas about one thing (see, e.g., E2p35s) and he also maintains that to have an idea that x is just to judge that x (see, e.g., the discussion of a winged horse at E2p49cs).

Second, Steinberg contends that, for Spinoza, value judgments are resistant to revision (24). I suppose that, like the desires that are associated with them, value judgments can be stubborn. Themes in Spinoza's account of the passions, however, including vacillation and the continual susceptibility to new passion, suggest that for many people most of the time, part of the problem is that we continuously arrive at new value judgments.

In Chapter 2, Steinberg defends the view, against John Pocock and others, that Spinoza is not a natural lawyer. He concedes that Spinoza uses the terminology of natural law -- ius, lex, imperium, and so on -- but argues that Spinoza does so only in order to "drain it of its normative significance" (39). A theme of the chapter and its most important result for the arguments that follow is that obligation, right, and duty are, for Spinoza, to be understood in terms of utility or perceived utility only. The chapter is a clear and strong contribution to this debate, not least because it sets out a clear way of understanding what is at stake. Steinberg suggests that we can only take Spinoza to be a natural lawyer if the traditional terminology refers to something other than a utilitarian theory.

Lex is, I think, a particularly interesting case. Steinberg argues that a natural lawyer would take natural law to be imposed on us by God but that Spinoza does not conceive of God as a law-giver. This is certainly true of Spinoza in the Ethics (see e.g., E1App), and I agree that it is Spinoza's considered view. This is one area, however, where the TTP raises problems for the view that Spinoza's works present a single coherent doctrine. The tenets of universal faith in TTP's Chapter 14 repeatedly require conceiving of God as a director and judge who must be obeyed.

Chapters 3 and 4 concern liberty. The thesis of Chapter 3 is that, on Spinoza's view, states ought to liberate or empower their citizens as far as possible. Steinberg, drawing correctly on the point that Spinoza identifies freedom and power, defends the thesis extremely well against critics who have taken Spinoza to be a classical liberal.

In Chapter 4 Steinberg argues that Spinoza promotes the cultivation of hope rather than fear as means by which states can empower citizens, and he defends the internal coherence of this view. The chapter is a valuable contribution to our understanding of Spinoza. The textual evidence that Steinberg presents in the chapter's introduction and in Section 4.3 for the first part of his thesis is not emphasized enough in other accounts of Spinoza's politics and deserves careful critical attention. Spinoza does, Steinberg shows, clearly emphasize hope and a more stable expectation of the good, security or confidence (securitas), as passions characteristic of good societies.

One reservation: Steinberg goes a step too far in characterizing devotion as a kind of hope (91). Spinoza does indeed make devotion a powerful political tool, particularly in the TTP. In his accounts of the affects, however, he clearly distinguishes devotion from hope. Devotion is a kind of love joined to wonder or veneration (Ep52s). Following Spinoza's definition of 'devotion', he writes that other affects might also join to wonder, and he includes hope in the list of affects. Devotion, then, is not hope. It is a different passion, which is also socially valuable. Notably, I think, whereas hope and security may be cultivated by a variety of means, the account of Moses in TTP 5 suggests that devotion is a passion characteristic of religion.

In Chapter 5, Steinberg argues that, on Spinoza's view, the state helps citizens by mitigating the effects of fortune. Steinberg offers an interesting argument that Spinoza's "accommodationism" -- a willingness to adjust one's language and behavior to the expectations of one's own society -- which has a highly personal form in his early work, is further expressed in a well-run state's attention to the ingenia of its citizens. Simply making rational precepts into laws will not be the most effective way to help citizens.

Steinberg argues in Chapter 6 that the TTP is a sustained, systematic attack on clerical power and the corrupt and corrupting institutions that it produces (130). The chapter includes a detailed and convincing account of the hazards that Spinoza finds in the clergy. I have long wondered why Spinoza thinks that giving religious authority to law-makers is a solution to the hazards that the clergy might make. Does that not just make the law-makers into clergy? Steinberg's largely sympathetic account of the TTP does not resolve this problem for me. He does, however, in emphasizing Spinoza's concern about the hazards of clerical power, set the stage for a powerful conception of the unity of the TTP and the TP in the next chapter.

In Chapter 7, Steinberg defends the view that Spinoza was a democrat throughout his different works (164) and that his preference for democracy has a consequentialist basis: it is the best means promoting the improvement of citizens (173). In Section 7.2, Steinberg argues -- this is my, perhaps controversial, rewording -- that our stubborn conceptions of ourselves as equals make democratic institutions more able than others to give us hope and security. This basic consequentialist explanation of Spinoza's egalitarianism effectively undermines arguments that Spinoza is a principled egalitarian. I agree with Steinberg on this point and find his argument convincing, but I should emphasize the difficulty of the subject. Steinberg's position is that Spinoza offers one largely coherent politics in the TTP and TP. Here, rather than allowing that Spinoza offers different views in the two works, Steinberg must acknowledge that the TTP offers some evidence of principled egalitarianism where the TP does not and then argue that this evidence ought to be discounted.

Section 7.3 elegantly brings together the TTP and the TP. In it, Steinberg argues that in the TP Spinoza takes democracy to be the best form of government epistemically in the sense that through democratic procedures we most frequently arrive at good decisions. This advantage is only contingent, however. We need good epistemic conditions for these good results to follow, and the TTP stands as an extended attempt to secure those good conditions against one of the greatest threats to them, disruptive clergy. Chapter 7 offers a number of controversial interpretative views, but it is engaging and exceptionally well argued. It is the heart of the book.

Finally, in Chapter 8, Steinberg argues that the state contributes to salvation and blessedness, and in so doing attempts once again to show the overall coherence of Spinoza's views. The opening sections of the chapter offer a useful summary of a good deal of recent work on Ethics 5. Section 8.5 offers the most direct view about the role of the state in promoting salvation: it can prevent disruptive social institutions from developing; it can promote security and hope by shaping the ingenia of citizens; and it can bring about conditions in which our potential to help one another is more easily realized.

Steinberg presents a strong case, grounded in history, philosophy, and political theory, for finding a view about politics in Spinoza that is, in its basic commitments, coherent and unchanged across Spinoza's works. The book is an excellent starting point for advanced students and scholars of Spinoza's political thought.