Spinoza's Political Treatise: A Critical Guide

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Yitzhak Y. Melamed and Hasana Sharp (eds.), Spinoza's Political Treatise: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 215pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107170582.

Reviewed by Wiep van Bunge, Erasmus University Rotterdam


Baruch (or Benedict) de Spinoza is best known for two books: the Ethica (E), completed in 1675 but only published in his Opera Posthuma of 1677; and the Tractatus theologico-politicus (TTP), published anonymously in 1670. Although these books are widely held to be masterpieces today, much ink has been spilled over the question of how the two books are related given crucial differences in their style and the topics they address. Whereas the E provides us 'in the manner of geometry' with a metaphysics, a philosophy of mind, and a moral psychology, the TTP offers a philosophical analysis of theology and the foundations of politics. And, where the E provides one with a guide to true happiness, the TTP has been regarded as a highly polemical pamphlet - a political intervention during the crisis of De Witt's regime in the Dutch Republic (which came to a dreadful denouement in the summer of 1672). Over the past few decades, philosophers and historians have not only tried to establish commonalities between the E and the TTP, but also increasingly have been giving attention to his lesser writings, including the Tractatus politicus (TP), on which Spinoza was working at the time of his sudden death on February 21, 1677 in The Hague. This raises further questions about the relationship between his various writings. Hence, the papers in this collection edited by Yitzhak Melamed and Hasana Sharp serve to address the more pertinent issues involved in Spinoza's work.

Michael A. Rosenthal's essay on political explanation, for instance, investigates the new 'so-called realism' in the TP, which followed the collapse of the Dutch regime known as 'True Freedom'. This contrasts the idea that 'man is most his own master when he is most led by reason' against claims made later in Spinoza's life, which analyze men 'as they are'. Rosenthal argues that the tension resulting from this juxtaposition of descriptive and normative proclamations should be analyzed on the basis of the recognition that in both the TTP and the TP, Spinoza makes a crucial distinction between sociological, normative, and narrative accounts of politics; and further, because these accounts are closely related, the differences separating the TTP from the TP may well have been overrated.

Julie E. Cooper's 'Statesmen versus Philosophers' is likewise concerned with Spinoza's method. While both the E and the TTP are largely characterized by Spinoza's commitment to the specific methods to be pursued in philosophy and in the interpretation of Scripture, it is far from obvious which particular method is put to work in the TP, although its author claimed to have based his analysis on a contemplation of human affects as properties belonging to human nature. Situating Spinoza between Machiavelli and Hobbes, Cooper argues that the TP's abstract reasoning should not be interpreted as a revolutionary endorsement of democracy, but was rather aimed at forestalling controversy and dissent.

Moira Gatens, on the other hand, focuses on Spinoza's reluctance to define 'a robust notion of a human nature,' which is most characteristic of the E. Instead, or so it would seem, the mature Spinoza recognized similarities between individual human essences, which leads Gatens to a further analysis of the question whether Spinoza, in view of his exclusion of women from the political process, did not endorse two separate notions of human nature, one for men and one for women.

Spinoza's comments on women also figure prominently in Susan James's discussion of the affect of envy. In the E, part IV, Spinoza still stresses man's innate tendency to co-operate, but in the TP, the divisive nature of the affects takes center stage. Apparently, having lost faith in the social potential of religion, he turned his attention to practical politics and the lessons to be learned from history. James eloquently suggests that Spinoza's views on women may well be taken to illustrate how in the TTP he 'gives history priority over philosophy'.

Chantal Jaquet tackles the issue whether, and to what extent, Spinoza was prepared to regard the longing for vengeance of common injury as 'a possible principle for the union and creation of a political body'. By highlighting the distinction between the desire for revenge, understood as cupiditas, from desiderium, Jaquet argues that in the latter case it would seem Spinoza felt it could serve as a righteous cause for action, serving political unity.

Hasana Sharp focuses on the analogy Spinoza draws in the TP between the oikos and the polis. According to Sharp, the way in which Spinoza uses the analogy brings out the difficulty of classifying his political thought with respect to the Aristotelian and Hobbesian traditions in particular. Sharp then contextualizes Spinoza's originality in his recognition that both reason and harmony actually presuppose contestation and strife.

Mogens Lærke turns his attention to Spinoza's account in the TP of a religio patriae, a national religion -- he asks: how does it relate to Spinoza's plea in the TTP in favor of freedom of thought? Having determined the contents of the natural religion, which in the TTP are defined as doctrines of universal faith (i.e. doctrines that are indifferent to truth and only result in pious behavior), Laerke believes that Spinoza's national religion should not be thought of as yet another 'sect' advocating any particular doctrine. Instead, it should serve as an institutional framework that helps to define religion as such.

Daniel Garber also concentrates on the relationship between religion and the civil state in the TP, but he argues that the national religion proposed by Spinoza is not based on what French scholars have dubbed the 'credo minimum' contained in the TTP. Garber argues that Spinoza's recommendation to establish a universal religion is actually restricted to aristocracies alone. According to Garber, we should not lose sight of the fact that from Spinoza's perspective, faith leads to obedience, and that aristocracies are particularly vulnerable to sectarianism. As a consequence, their rulers are best advised to institutionalize a minimal religion, binding their subjects without too much force.

Theo Verbeek continues the discussion of Spinoza's conception of aristocracy, arguing that there is every reason to assume it was Spinoza's preferred system of government. While many experts have been especially fascinated by Spinoza's comments on democracy, the fact remains that he never completed his chapter on the subject. Verbeek focuses on Spinoza's ideas concerning the counselors in a patrician commonwealth, such as the towns of the province of Holland.

Melamed sheds light on remarks made in the seventh chapter of the TP, according to which states can grow too powerful, or so it would seem. Does this not conflict with Spinoza's statement in the E (3p12) that we always strive to increase our power of acting? It does not, Melamed concludes, for stability should be any state's first priority: states should not be tempted to seek the possessions of their neighbors as doing so could easily result in 'resentment and hatred' among the population of the subordinated state, creating a dialectical dependency upon the subordinated neighbor.

Justin Steinberg offers a coherent interpretation of Spinoza's absolutism against the background of Bodin and Hobbes. He highlights the extent to which Spinoza shared their commitment to the independence, indivisibility, and irresistibility of the sovereign's authority. Yet, Spinoza also respected constitutional limits with regard to the exercise of state power and favored mixed forms of sovereignty. Steinberg neatly fleshes out how Spinoza was able to combine absolutism with these restrictions by drawing attention to the way in which Spinoza established that rights only hold to the extent they can be exercised.

In the concluding paper, Filippo Del Lucchese expands Steinberg's historical comparison of absolutism to an analysis of Spinoza's dependence on Machiavelli, and, in particular, on his assessment of 'conflictuality' as being inherent to politics as such. Inspired by Antonio Negri's reading of Spinoza, Del Lucchese's Spinoza remains a revolutionary, in the sense that 'Spinoza's democracy gives to the multitude the right that it deserves, because it fully recognizes it in its true power, namely as a power, first and foremost, to actively resist other powers, to struggle against other powers'.

The editors of this volume fully deserve to be congratulated for having produced the first collection of essays in English on Spinoza's last work. The quality of the papers presented leaves little to be desired and the editing is flawless. Over the past few decades on the European continent, and in France and Italy in particular, the TP has inspired a considerable literature. Now that Anglophone experts are starting to recognize the importance of Spinoza's (sadly) unfinished treatise, there is every reason to look forward to a further proliferation of the particular effort to situate and grasp the TP not only in the context of Spinoza's other major works, but also against the background of the stormy political climate of his day and age, and among the wider history of early modern political thought.