Spinoza’s Religion: A New Reading of the Ethics

Spinoza S Religion

Clare Carlisle, Spinoza’s Religion: A New Reading of the Ethics, Princeton University Press, 2021, 288pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780691176598.

Reviewed by Alexander Douglas, University of St Andrews


Spinoza is often taken to be an opponent of religion. Clare Carlisle’s book presents him, rather, as challenging standard conceptions of religion and offering a religion of his own.

Let me begin by putting Carlisle’s book in context.

Back in the early 2000s, religion-bashing became an internet craze. A few of the key influencers tried their hand at compiling a canon of secular texts: Christopher Hitchens edited The Portable Atheist (Da Capo, 2007), while Anthony Grayling produced The Good Book (Bloomsbury, 2011). Included in both were the words of Spinoza.

The image of Spinoza as an irreligious, perhaps even antireligious, figure isn’t the product of ignorance. Nobody knows more about Spinoza than Steven Nadler, who opens a recent book on him by diagnosing religion as a pandemic of irrationality: “Every day billions of people devote a significant amount of time to worshipping an imaginary being” (Nadler 2020, 1). He goes on to present Spinoza’s thought as the cure. Of course Spinoza believed in a kind of God, but, as discussed below, Nadler argues that he wasn’t a theist in any meaningful sense.

But then what does Spinoza have to teach us? Spinoza’s philosophical masterpiece is called the Ethics, so it is natural for those who read him as an irreligionist to find in it a manual of atheist morality. Nadler ends with a summary of “the right way of living” as his Spinoza envisages it. This turns out to be “an ‘active’ life of autonomy, virtue, and power”, of “desire guided by reason and knowledge, not by irrational passions”, of doing “what is truly in [your] own best interest (as well as in the best interest of others), not what merely appears to be good or happens to be a source of pleasure” (Nadler 2020, 202). This all sounds eminently sensible. But upon reflection it is so sensible as to raise a worry: do we need to read Spinoza for this? This reading of Spinoza seems to limit his impact to telling sensible, moderate, secular naturalists—the majority, I think, within academic philosophy—what they already know in theory if not in practice.

There are, however, other ways to read Spinoza, in which he challenges us much more. Carlisle’s book goes in this category. Her Spinoza remains as radical as ever—as challenging to contemporary secularist dogmas as to early modern religious ones. Spinoza has something to tell us that we are unlikely to already believe.


Most scholars who resist reading Spinoza as a simple enemy of religion reject not so much the characterisation of Spinoza’s thought as the binary framing of the question it implies: religion—for or against? Now, with Carlisle’s book, we have the case fully laid out against this framing. She begins: “Benedict de Spinoza did not have a religion—at least in the usual sense of the word” (1). Given this, she admits, “the title of this book contains an irony, and perhaps for some a provocation” (2). Her title reveals her thesis that Spinoza did have a religion. But it is a religion outside the usual sense of the word. More than this, his thought shows what is wrong with that usual sense: “Spinoza’s religion forces us to rethink the concept of religion itself” (2). Most of the binary oppositions in terms of which we think of religion today—religion versus science, versus secularism, versus modernity, versus rationality, etc.—are products of the sort of modernity that was coming into being during Spinoza’s lifetime. Spinoza offers us not only a different concept of religion, but “an alternative modernity” (3).

The central claim for Carlisle is that, rather than expunging traditional religious ideas—divine creation, the afterlife of the soul, etc.—from a modern scientific picture, Spinoza reinterprets them in a way that fits neither of the categories religious or secular. What he constructs in the Ethics is a philosophical theology in the broad sense. His thought is governed by a core theological principle, that “whatever is, is in God” (Ethics 1p15). The book is largely an exposition of the meaning of this principle and its connection to other themes in Spinoza. Many of these themes—beatitude, eternal life, the love of God—were clearly of central importance to Spinoza. Yet in recent scholarship they are often either neglected or reduced to categories more consistent with secular naturalism.

Carlisle’s project also involves exploring Spinoza’s relationship with Christianity, providing arguments for “locating the Ethics within the Latinate lineage of Christian thought” (14). It is strange to me that there hasn’t been more interest among scholars on the Christian influences on Spinoza, who after all consistently refers to Jesus not by name, as he easily could have, but as “Christus”—the Christ. This is not to say that Spinoza was a Christian. Nor is it to downplay the importance of the Jewish tradition in which he was raised—an influence that has been thoroughly studied. It is only to note that his writings are shot through with undeniably Christian themes, and Carlisle is one of few scholars unwilling to ignore them or explain them away.


Chapter One, on the theme of Spinoza’s devotion, begins with Pierre Bayle’s characterisation of Spinoza. On one hand, Bayle denounced Spinoza as an atheist. On the other, he found in his writings “echoes of various religious teachings: Persian ‘sufism’ and ‘cabalism’; some ancient Indian doctrines; the contemplative practices of a Chinese sect named Foe Kiao, founded around the same time as Christianity” (19). Bayle fixates on this latter sect, whom he believes pursued an ideal of “quietude”, though they hold that:

after a man has arrived at the state of quietude, he may follow the ordinary course of life outwardly, and teach others the commonly received doctrine. It is only privately and inwardly that he ought to practise the contemplative exercise of Beatitude. (19)

Although Carlisle doesn’t mention it, Bayle’s “Foe Kiao” is a corruption of the Chinese term for Buddhism (fójiào 佛教), while “founded around the same time as Christianity” reflects a then-common belief about the arrival of Buddhism in China (Meynard 2011). The term “Beatitude” that Bayle uses to describe the “contemplative exercise” of Buddhism is used by Spinoza in the final part of the Ethics to define his ultimate good: “the intellectual love of God” (5p26s), also described as a state of “acquiescence of the soul”. Effectively, then, Bayle characterises Spinoza as a kind of bodhisattva, and Carlisle’s chapter goes on to explore the ways in which his philosophical project can be seen as a sort of spiritual practice, pursuing inner peace in the light of truth, in which he hoped to initiate others.

Chapter Two begins her rigorous analysis of the text of Spinoza’s Ethics, identifying its form as

structural, architectural: it resembles an exquisitely carved crystal, cut as intricately on the inside as on the outside, hollowed into numerous interconnected chambers and corridors, its myriad colourless surfaces precisely formed and highly polished. (35)

She finds at the heart of this structure a set of “super-propositions”: those propositions that are cited more than ten times in the proofs of other propositions. One of these is the central principle mentioned above, in 1p15: “Whatever is, is in God, and nothing can be or be conceived without God”.

Chapter Three explains how “‘Being-in-God’ is the fundamental tenet of Spinoza’s thought” (56)—given Carlisle’s overall thesis we can say: of Spinoza’s religion. This is the most difficult chapter in the book. The notion of “being-in-God” is an enormous topic for a short chapter, and Carlisle’s treatment, while elegant, is highly compressed. Much more than in the other chapters, Carlisle occasionally enters into a theological idiom that philosophers might struggle to penetrate. What is clear, in any case, is very interesting. Carlisle suggests that Spinoza advances “being-in-God” both as a normative goal—something we should strive after—and as a positive fact: “the fundamental and immediate truth about anything that is—anything at all—is that it is in God” (56).

The normative goal is left for the Chapters Four and Five. Staying with Chapter Three, however, what is the meaning of “in” in the claim that everything is in God? It cannot mean “in” as a part, since Spinoza is clear that God has no parts (in the Scholium to the “super-proposition” of Ethics 1p15). Carlisle repeats a few times the intriguing assertion that “we should be prepared to understand ‘being-in’ to express both difference and identity” (59, 64). So in some sense—a sense found also in Aquinas—Spinoza suggests that all things are identical with God, though they are also different from God. This means that Carlisle’s reading has Spinoza rejecting the Indiscernibility of Identicals—an implication that has been found elsewhere in his writing by John Morrison (Morrison 2017).

Carlisle goes against the majority of Spinoza’s interpreters in refusing to read his famous phrase, “Deus sive Natura”, as entailing a strict identity between God and nature. She notes how this proposed identity prompts some readers, Nadler for instance, to reduce Spinoza’s position to a thinly-disguised atheist naturalism: there is only the natural world, misleadingly called “Deus”. Carlisle builds a textual case against this, with justification: Edwin Curley has explained that Spinoza’s use of “sive” is much more complicated than is often assumed (Spinoza 2016, 2:610–12). For her, the relation between God and the natural world, expressed in “Deus sive Natura”, is not one of strict identity but rather the paradoxical hybrid of identity and difference expressed by “being-in”. Many readers who see Spinoza as an arch “rationalist” can’t bear the thought that such paradoxical concepts could feature in his thinking, but they might consider the possibility that their own notions of what is “rational” are in need of expansion.

Carlisle’s next three chapters look to being-in-God as a normative goal. Being-in-God, though ubiquitous, can come in degrees. We are to strive after being-in-God as much as possible. This is not a categorical imperative; it is a hypothetical one with the antecedent: “if you want to stop being in turmoil”. Chapter Four begins with a quotation from Augustine: “Our heart is restless until it rests in you [God]” (79). The same sentiment is conveyed by Spinoza, who sees the soul as thrown about by commotions and fluctuations—waves on the sea driven by opposing winds, as he describes it at one point (Ethics 3p59s)—until it finds “a resting-place (animi acquiescentia) constituted by being-in-God” (79). What prevents us from finding this inner peace is the pursuit of goals external to ourselves. To find rest by being-in-God is to achieve some degree of the perfect self-sufficiency enjoyed by God: to find that “our telos does not lie outside our activity, our life, our being, but within it” (88). Like Fung Yulan (Fung 1997, ch.10), I see here a connection between Spinozist “acquiescence” and the Daoist concept of wuwei (無為)—spontaneous action for its own sake rather than in pursuit of external goals.[1]

Chapters Seven and Eight engage with more religious ideas in Spinoza: the love of God and eternal life. Again, I can’t do justice to this rich discussion here. But I hope the contrast with the sort of sensible secularism often ascribed to Spinoza is clear. Carlisle’s Spinoza appears to recommend a sort of spiritual practice towards a goal that is much less familiar than that of trying to be reasonable in our desires and do what really is in our own best interests. Of course, and not as an unrelated matter, it is also much more difficult to understand. As Spinoza would say, all luminous things are as difficult as they are rare.

Chapter Nine returns to the question of Spinoza’s religion and the “alternative modernity” he offers us. Carlisle proposes that a Spinozist conception of religion, unlike what we have inherited from modernity, is “neither a doctrine nor a belief, neither a sect nor a church” (183). Rather, “It is a virtue”—the virtue of being oriented towards being-in-God. As such, it can accommodate “the religious diversity that now shapes modern cities, schools and universities” while also resisting the “diseases of modernity: dualism, nihilism, voluntarism, reductive materialism, subjectivism” (183). It can, in other words, offer secularists some of what they want and those who reach for religious traditions some of what they want. Whether it will be enough for either, of course, remains to be seen.


At the closing of the Afterword, Carlisle summarises her contribution to Spinoza scholarship beautifully: “Spinoza’s conception of God as ontological ground not only secures the intelligibility of being, but also provides a resting-place for desire” (188). Spinoza scholars have been working very hard at making sense of Spinoza’s commitment to the first of these—the intelligibility of being. Michael Della Rocca even developed an influential interpretation of Spinoza according to which being is intelligibility (Della Rocca 2008).

But the second—the resting place for desire—the ultimate state of beatitude that Spinoza was at pains to reveal as a possibility for spiritual seekers—this has received far less attention. Perhaps this is because it threatens the dominant image of Spinoza. The term beatitude has a very definite legacy in what Carlisle calls the “Latinate lineage of Christian thought”: Aquinas, for instance, gave a powerful argument against its achievability within mortal life (Aquinas 1894, 1a2ae, 1–5). The argument is, roughly, that since beatitude means the ultimate resting place of desire, it can’t leave anything to be desired; yet a good that will one day pass away leaves something to be desired, namely its continuation for at least a bit longer. Spinoza, of course, avoided this by presenting a vision of an ultimate reality in which things do not pass away at all. As Carlisle puts it: “all the things of this world have some share in God’s eternity” (188). This is because all things are God in a sense—the sense expressed by “being-in-God”.

But this takes us far from the image of Spinoza as a hero of secular naturalism. Many will object, but I’m sure I’m not the only person who feels excited to explore the new world of interpretation that Carlisle has opened up by taking Spinoza’s religion seriously.


Aquinas, Thomas. 1894. Summa Theologica. Rome: Forzani.

Della Rocca, Michael. 2008. Spinoza. London: Routledge.

Fung, Yu-lan. 1997. A Short History of Chinese Philosophy. Edited by Derk Bodde. New York: Free Press.

Meynard, Thierry. 2011. “Chinese Buddhism and the Threat of Atheism in Seventeenth-Century Europe.” Buddhist-Christian Studies 31: 3–23.

Morrison, John. 2017. “Two Puzzles about Thought and Identity in Spinoza.” In Cambridge Critical Guide to Spinoza’s Ethics, edited by Yitzhak Melamed, 56–81.

Nadler, Steven. 2020. Think Least of Death: Spinoza on How to Live and How to Die. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Spinoza, Benedictus de. 2016. The Collected Works of Spinoza. Translated by Edwin Curley. Vol. 2. Princeton: Princeton University Press.


[1] The term is found in Confucius, but the Daoist concept of it is very particular.