Spirituality for the Skeptic: The Thoughtful Love of Life

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Solomon, Robert C., Spirituality for the Skeptic: The Thoughtful Love of Life, Oxford University Press, 2002, 159pp, $26.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195134672

Reviewed by William Lad Sessions, Washington and Lee University


Prolific Robert Solomon's latest book is an upbeat reworking of The Joy of Philosophy (Oxford University Press, 1999). In that earlier work, Solomon criticized contemporary Anglo-American academic philosophy for desiccating and destroying the joyful quest for wisdom that enticed him (and many others) into philosophy in the first place. In this short book, borrowing liberally from "Joy" and other published writings, Solomon seeks to provide a positive account of what philosophy, conceived in light of its rich heritage, can provide toward living a full and vibrant life here and now. What it can provide, according to Solomon, is "Spirituality" (which I shall capitalize to signal Solomon's distinctive version), a protean category that, Hegel-like, engages and absorbs everything in sight-from passion, rationality and cosmic trust to tragedy, fatalism and the soul. It is a virtuoso performance by a masterful teacher, engagingly written and surely attractive to a popular audience. Yet its scholarly philosophical impact, as Solomon surely knows, is likely to be minimal, for reasons I will mention later.

But first, a synopsis. Spirituality is wrestled away from religion and naturalized as "the thoughtful love of life" (his "hallmark-card phrase" (ix)). Religion has apparently long seemed largely repellent to Solomon, its history "a horror story" (xiii), its dogmas incredible, its organizations dangerous, its piety stifling to true Spirituality. Instead, he seeks "a nonreligious, noninstitutional, nontheological, nonscriptural, nonexclusive sense of spirituality, one which is not self-righteous, which is not based on Belief, which is not dogmatic, which is not antiscience, which is not other-worldly, which is not uncritical or cultist or kinky." (xii) More positively, Spirituality is both thought and passion:

Spirituality means to me the grand and thoughtful passions of life and a life lived in accordance with those grand thoughts and passions. Spirituality embraces love, trust, reverence, and wisdom, as well as the most terrifying aspects of life, tragedy, and death." (6)

It is a "mode of being" (9) that is an "expansion of the self" (7), a Nietzschean process of self-overcoming and growth, the full rich Good Life for a human being whose only world is this world.

Chapter 1 distances Spirituality from religion, makes friendly with science, and basically identifies Spirituality with philosophy. Solomon firmly excludes recourse to anything transcending this life; views of the Beyond are stumbling metaphors, and mystical experiences are rare and ineffable, unavailable and unhelpful. "In place of the dubious purpose of transcending life, let us defend the ideal of transcending ourselves in life." (24) Granted, traditional religion "is primarily belonging" not believing (12) (hence the essential irrelevance of theology), and this is something Solomon endorses, but the belonging he seeks includes everyone, not just some favored sect. Naturalized Spirituality is not science, but there is no conflict, only synergy, between them. Philosophy as "an attempt to come to grips with the perennial, personal, and universal human problems of meaning" (26) was once kin to Spirituality, though now it seems a distant relation. But philosophy can reclaim its rightful inheritance, by embracing myth, passion and fate. "Philosophy, as Plato clearly saw, is a spiritual practice." (27)

Chapter 2 explores Spirituality as passion. In Solomon's view, passion is not necessarily irrational; indeed, some passions-particularly (erotic) love, reverence and trust-are "definitive of rationality" (28). A passionate life is "defined by emotions, by impassioned engagements and quests, by embracing affections." (29) Certain emotions, to be sure, are ruled out: envy, resentment, war hysteria, racism-even fanaticism for Texas football (31). Yet Nietzsche had it right in conceiving of "the overflowing spirituality of a passionate life" (43).

Chapter 3 examines Spirituality as "cosmic trust," "a determined stance toward the world" (44), ". way of being in the world" (45). It is "authentic trust," an acceptance born of experience, refined by reflection, and intentionally chosen. Once again envy and resentment emerge as the villainous opposites (53f), but beyond them lie contentment and forgiveness-indeed, "forgiving the world for the misfortunes it (inevitably) inflicts upon us." (57)

Chapter 4 construes Spirituality as rationality, not dry abstracted thought, but engaged passionate thoughtfulness. Reason is not the enemy of the passions, but their friend. Indeed, says Solomon, "I want to suggest that reason and the passions are not only complementary. They are ultimately one and the same." Reason thus understood is "contingent on our human natures, and on our particular cultures as well;" emotions constitute "our ultimate ends in life, the things we really do and should care about," and reason helps to achieve those ends and thereby enrich our lives (61). Rationality is not limited to instrumental reasoning or abstract ratiocination. Nor is it the pursuit of self-interest narrowly construed. Instead, rationality is "having the right emotions, or caring about the right sorts of things" (70).

Chapter 5 is entitled "Facing Up to Tragedy," and that is what Solomon wants philosophy to help us to do, by giving meaning to suffering. He rejects causal stories that allow us to affix blame for tragedy; concepts of justice, desert and entitlement are inapplicable, for "tragedy, not justice, is the ultimate upshot of life" (80). Since tragedy cannot be explained, Solomon foregoes all heavens and hells, however "sweet" and "understandable" they may be (82). Life is simply not fair, and we need to "embrace" tragedy "as an essential part of the life we love and for which we should be so grateful" (88).

In Chapter 6, Solomon insists that Spirituality entails a certain sort of fatalism-not a rigid determinism but something compatible with existential freedom. "Freedom, responsibility, and an acceptance of one's fate go hand in hand and in may ways depend upon one another." (91) Fatalism is not an excuse for lack of effort, but acceptance of what is beyond one's control-one's culture and times, one's contingent yet enveloping situation. Fate is freedom's rootedness, and the appropriate response to one's fate should be gratitude ("an emotion," Solomon notes with tongue in cheek, that is "too little appreciated in ethics or in philosophy generally" (104)). We should be grateful because "we are the beneficiaries of a (more or less) benign universe," even if there is no one to whom we should be grateful: "We might say that one is grateful not only for one's life but to one's life-or rather to life-as well." (105)

Chapter 7 explores the meaning of death. Spirituality accepts "death as the completion of life, as the closure that gives an individual life its narrative significance in a larger whole" (107-8). Solomon berates various philosophical and religious traditions-from ancient Egyptian to modern American-for denying death in various ways, chiefly by fleeing to a transcendent afterlife and forgetting that death will happen to oneself. But he also has critical words for those who make a fetish of death, glorying in the "death experience" (this includes not only "the S and M crowd" and Calvin Klein fashions but also Heidegger and Foucault), and those stoics for whom "death is nothing" (if this slogan implies that life is nothing). Instead, "the meaning of death comes down to the meaning of life, nothing less, and nothing more." (119)

The culminating Chapter 8 links Spirituality to self, soul and spirit. Spirituality is "enlargement of the self" (123), expanding our self-identity (or is it our sense of identity?) from the isolated individual to the social soul-full self. (Solomon here takes a three-page excursion into Asian philosophy (130-132).) Rather than a Cartesian (or Augustinian) "vast and largely unexplored inner cavern" (133), the soul should be pictured in social terms: "One's identity is a social construct. An identity crisis is a social crisis." (136) Soul is not a "metaphysical eternal nugget" but a process of transformation from narrow and impoverished individuality through discipline and Spirituality to broad and rich relationship with the world (139-140).

Reactions to this book will vary with the audience. Undergraduates will enjoy Solomon's lively prose and vivid presentation of Existentialist views that connect to their tender and burgeoning sense of self. Humanists hankering to talk about the meaning of their lives-or seeking a "philosophy of life"-without recourse to transcendence will gladly join in Solomon's quest for wisdom and a "thoughtful love of life." People who retain, or seek, a sense of transcendence will be alternately bemused by Solomon's tethering of spirit to this world and appalled at his broad-brush caricatures of religion.

But what about Anglo-American (chiefly but not solely "analytic") academic philosophers? Since they are the targets of much of Solomon's polemics, will they rise up in wounded indignation to set him straight? Not likely. More probably, their reaction will be a collective shrug, and then back to business. Solomon simply has not presented a case in ways that they will find clear and cogent enough to engage. It is not that he writes turgid prose; on the contrary. The problem rather is his affinity for thinking, as he puts it in the Introduction, "in the spirit of Hegel," where large concepts and themes are painted with broad brushes, layered over with colorful anecdotes, and connected by the copula "is" to many apparently quite different concepts. Thus Spirituality for Solomon is identified in one way or another with philosophy, rationality, passion, fate, self, soul, reverence, trust, contentment, forgiveness, and Lord knows what else. In this kind of light, everything "is" something else, maybe everything else, and careful analysis of distinctions and connections goes out the window. Moreover, almost everything is grist for Solomon's mill-from Heidegger to Lao Tzu to TV shows-with little concern for levels of depth and significance. Solomon's popularity comes at a price.

In a way the inevitable neglect of this book by professional philosophers is a pity, for Solomon is pursuing broad and vital themes that could well be engaged by others, for both private and public benefit. Moreover, the fault lies on both sides. Solomon would point a nagging finger at academic professionals, so caught up in their scholastic desk jobs that they have lost all sense of philosophy as a way of life. But Solomon needs to make a more enticing offer to these academics-by entering into their painstaking labors of analysis and argument. There is much in his work that a sensitive contemporary thinker who has given up on transcendence can enjoy. But there is much more work-more rigorous and careful work-to be done before that enjoyment can become truly philosophical enlightenment.