Splitsville USA: A Democratic Argument for Breaking Up the United States


Christopher F. Zurn, Splitsville USA: A Democratic Argument for Breaking Up the United States, Routledge, 2023, 215pp., $48.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781032429793.

Reviewed by Peter Stone, Trinity College Dublin


The idea of breaking up the United States is today mostly confined to the lunatic fringe—to the likes of Rep. Marjorie Taylor Greene (R-GA), for example (McCann Ramirez 2023). Christopher Zurn seeks to change that. His new book, Splitsville USA: A Democratic Argument for Breaking Up the United States, endeavours to move the idea into mainstream U.S. political discourse. In doing so, Zurn has performed a valuable service. When Greene says something that sounds stupid, it’s hard to tell if it is the source or the idea itself that is the problem. Zurn’s book, however, offers a more mature and sophisticated defence of the idea than anything Greene is capable of producing. If the idea still sounds bad—and trust me, it does—you can be sure that it is not for lack of serious and sustained effort.

According to Zurn, there is “a very serious and growing sickness at the heart of American democracy: namely, an increasing willingness among the citizenry and even more worrisomely among the political elite to disregard the results of elections whose outcomes they do not like” (13).[1] Democracy—in the “minimalist” sense of “the peaceful transfer of power in accordance with the results of free, fair and regular elections” (10)—depends upon a widespread acceptance of the results of those elections. Zurn calls this the “democratic precommitment” (18), and fears that Americans are increasingly rejecting it. This places the country on the road “either to democratic ungovernability. . .or to autocratic governability” (14). The decline of the democratic precommitment is the disease for which Zurn offers secession as a cure.

Zurn locates the cause of this disease in the “structural weaknesses in our republican institutions, accelerated by recent social and cultural changes” (13). What makes these institutions weak is that they “enable and encourage one party to maintain power without winning majorities in a two-party system” (25). These antimajoritarian features of the U.S. political system include the equal representation of states in the U.S. Senate; partisan redistricting; the Electoral College; the control over the Electoral College by state legislatures; the Supreme Court; and the extraordinarily demanding constitutional amendment process (26–31). The U.S. Constitution has had all of these features from the start, but four recent developments have made things worse: “decreasing adherence to norms of democratic politics, increases in partisan ‘mega-identity’ polarization, changes in the structures of the public sphere, and the increasing influence of money over American politics.” These changes have had the effect of “accelerating the lack of democratic precommitment” (31).

As a cure for this disease, Zurn proposes “Splitsville,” or “a peaceful, multilateral and mutually agreed upon breaking up of the United States.” This is a call for “negotiated dissolution,” not unilateral secession of the type that precipitated the U.S. Civil War (8). The exact terms of the breakup—including the number of successor states—are something that must be negotiated. Zurn does, however, offer some suggestions for conducting the breakup, including three possible post-dissolution maps—one with two nations based upon partisanship (red versus blue states), one with four nations based upon geographic region, and one (Zurn’s preferred option) with five nations based on historical culture (146, 183). He also insists upon “two principles…as serious moral constraints on the project of historical dissolution”: “non-violence” (the breakup must happen more-or-less peacefully) and “non-oppression” (the dissolution cannot “lead to substantial new oppression of any residents of the former United States”) (47, 48). To ensure the latter principle is honoured, “robust emigration rights” must be provided to allow individuals to “‘vote with their feet’ by exiting a newly formed nation they perceive as antithetical to their fundamental interests” (48).[2]

Zurn thus recommends Splitsville as “the democratic treatment for our democratic maladies” (44). He offers four reasons for believing this treatment would work. First, each successor nation would have to draft a new constitution. This would create “a chance to reboot representative democracy” by fixing those outdated features of the U.S. Constitution responsible for generating the current democratic sickness (49). Second, the smaller size of the new nations would be a benefit for democracy in itself. “[A] few smaller nations would be more governable and more democratically responsive than the larger single United States” (53). Third, “Folks increasingly favor Splitsville, and politicians are rightly sensitive to their opinions. We can expect, then, increasing incentives among political elites to consider and promote the idea” (60–61). Fourth, the “factors currently undermining Americans’ democratic precommitment are largely structural,” while at a cultural level the commitment to democracy remains strong. This culture “could be reestablished in new nations, nations that are without the structural incentives for entrenching minority rule in place” (62).

Zurn’s contention that American democracy is sick is difficult to deny. His diagnosis of that sickness, however, is much less convincing. Zurn is correct to note the ways that the U.S. political system enables minorities to obtain and maintain power. But why should this fact undermine the democratic precommitment? Is the idea supposed to be that majorities become frustrated at seeing their will persistently thwarted, and therefore lose faith in a political system that is rigged against them? Zurn never says as much, and such a story would not fit the U.S. case well. If anything, it is the political party that benefits from the U.S.’s antimajoritarian bias today—the Republican Party—that most actively denies the legitimacy of that system.

Now, about the Republican Party. Throughout Splitsville, Zurn demonstrates a bad case of “bothsiderism.” Zurn insists that the U.S. is dominated by two political parties each undermining the democratic precommitment by ruthlessly manipulating the political system. But doing so requires bending over backwards to pretend that the Republican Party’s contribution to this process is in no way special. And it really takes some effort to maintain this pretence; it is no coincidence that it is Marjorie Taylor Greene, and not Alexandria Ocasio-Cortez or Bernie Sanders, who is promoting disunion today.

Zurn’s bothsiderism manifests itself in several ways. On many occasions, he lists political actions he takes to be signs of America’s political dysfunction without mentioning the political party behind those actions. He speaks, for example, of “state legislatures [that] have proposed election law changes that would increase the power of partisan politicians, and also decrease the power of independent election officials over the actual counting of the ballots” (24). He mentions “Political organizations in the lead-up to the 2022 elections [which] are. . .recruiting and training lots of folks who deny the results of the 2020 elections. . .to help subvert future electoral results that don’t support their preferred candidates” (76). He decries “expert civil servants” finding “themselves increasingly subject to uncivil and sometimes violent contestation by hyped-up partisans.” (77). If Zurn has examples of Democrats doing any of these things, it would be nice if he provided them.

At other times, Zurn draws any equivalence he can, no matter how far-fetched, between the actions of the two political parties. “Trump’s refusal,” he writes, “to concede defeat in the 2020 election was foreshadowed by Stacey Abrams’s similar refusal in the 2018 George governor’s race” (3). To be clear, Abrams never alleged fraud in that election;[3] she simply contended that Georgia’s voting laws, and how they were enforced, unfairly advantaged her opponent (who also happened to be Georgia’s Secretary of State at the time). Is Zurn contending that her claim was obviously false? Is he equating this claim with the claim of Trump’s lawyers that the late Hugo Chavez orchestrated the creation of the Dominion Voting Systems technology that would hand the 2020 election to Biden (Sommer 2020)? And Abrams responded to her defeat in 2018 by filing a lawsuit challenging Georgia’s voting laws and by running again in 2022. Trump responded to his defeat in 2020 by attempting the armed overthrow of the U.S. government. To pretend that Abrams and Trump are equally guilty of undermining the democratic precommitment is just obscene.

Zurn refers again and again to Democrats and Republicans engaging in “tit for tat” in the struggle to maintain power (32, 36, 75, 86, 92). But he never provides any evidence of Democrats rigging the political system in their favour apart from the occasional case of gerrymandering (28).[4] The reason is obvious. American politics today is characterized, not by two parties engaged in a destructive game of tit for tat, but by an extremist political party seeking to undermine democracy and a mainstream party trying, with more or less enthusiasm, to maintain it. The extremist party exploits all of the features of the U.S. political system Zurn decries (equal representation of states in the Senate, the Electoral College, the Supreme Court). It uses bogus claims of voter fraud to entrench itself further by making electoral laws more restrictive.[5] And its leader used even more outlandish claims of this nature to justify an attempted coup in 2021. The democratic precommitment may be dying in the United States today, but that is because the Republican Party is trying to kill it.

If Zurn’s diagnosis of the country’s ills is mistaken, then his prescribed remedy will most likely prove ineffective. He assumes that post-dissolution politicians would design new constitutions that would remedy the worst ills of the current system. The new nations “would benefit from rebooting the constitutional machinery of representative democracy to mitigate many of the problematic structural features of our current political arrangements” (65). But would a Republican-dominated successor nation attempt such a reboot, or would it simply create the most perfectly designed one-party state it could devise? It’s a little hard to imagine Marjorie Taylor Greene playing the role of James Madison.[6]

Zurn hopes that Splitsville will be read, “not with the expectation of providing a blueprint for what should happen,” but rather as “a conversation opener inviting us to think and argue and deliberate—and ultimately decide—together on our political future” (205). This invitation to conversation is sorely needed in the current political climate. But Splitsville provides little reason to believe that the dissolution of the United States should be part of that conversation.


Fogel, Robert William. 1989. Without Consent or Contract: The Rise and Fall of American Slavery. New York: Norton.

Harvey, Josephine. 2023. Marjorie Taylor Greene Shares Unhinged Details Of Her 'National Divorce' Idea. 21 February. https://www.huffpost.com/entry/marjorie-taylor-greene-national-divorce-details_n_63f53f78e4b0c87f32f3ebdd.

Klar, Rebecca. 2019. Stacey Abrams Responds to RNC Chairwoman: ‘Concession Means to Say That the Process Was Fair’. 19 August. https://thehill.com/homenews/campaign/457934-stacey-abrams-responds-to-rnc-chairwoman-concession-means-to-say-that-the/.

McCann Ramirez, Nikki. 2023. “Marjorie Taylor Greene Says States Should ‘Consider Seceding From the Union’.” Rolling Stone, 11 September. https://www.rollingstone.com/politics/politics-news/marjorie-taylor-greene-states-consider-seceding-from-the-union-1234822567/.

Sommer, Will. 2020. Here’s How Hugo Chavez, Dead Since 2013, Became Responsible for Trump’s Election Loss. 19 November. https://www.thedailybeast.com/heres-how-hugo-chavez-dead-since-2013-became-responsible-for-trumps-election-loss.

[1] Technically, Zurn refers to this willingness as a “key symptom” of the sickness, and not the sickness itself. But it is difficult to understand his argument unless this “symptom” is in fact the disease itself.

[2] Presumably, Zurn’s right to emigrate also provides a right to immigrate to the successor nation of one’s choice. This is in contrast to Marjorie Taylor Greene, who would deny legal rights to Americans moving from blue states into red states under her secession “plan” (Harvey 2023).

[3] In the very article Zurn cites in support of this contention, Abrams notes that she does not deny the “legal sufficiency of the election” (Klar 2019).

[4] He further notes that “Congressional Democrats” in 2021 proposed “legal strictures against partisan or racially discriminatory gerrymandering by states” (86). It’s not obvious how such measures count as “tit for tat.”

[5] Zurn does briefly acknowledge Republican efforts to make voting more difficult, as well as Democratic opposition to those efforts. But he dismisses these efforts as unimportant because such measures “have little impact” and are “without a lot of actual payoff at the polls” (85). This is a shockingly breezy treatment of such a serious and controversial topic, and it is not at all clear that Zurn’s conclusion follows even if the factual claims were granted. A great many competitive elections in the U.S. today are won by razor-thin majorities, and so even mildly successful voter suppression efforts can turn defeats into victories for Republicans.

[6] The economic historian Robert Fogel has argued that had the Confederate States of America been permitted to secede peacefully, they would have strengthened the worldwide hand of reaction (Fogel 1989). Any post-Splitsville nations controlled by Republicans would similarly find natural allies in the Orbans and the Erdogans and the Putins of the world today.