Spying Through a Glass Darkly: The Ethics of Espionage and Counter-Intelligence


Cécile Fabre, Spying Through a Glass Darkly: The Ethics of Espionage and Counter-Intelligence, Oxford University Press, 2022, 251pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198833765.

Reviewed by C. A. J. Coady, University of Melbourne


Cécile Fabre has written an important and timely book about the conceptual shape and moral challenges of institutionalised political espionage. It is particularly welcome because contemporary philosophers in the broadly analytic tradition have written extensively and helpfully on the moral problems posed by war and terrorism, but they and other philosophers have mostly neglected the companion area of spying. Fabre’s book is the only philosophical book I know that tackles the range and depth of the moral problems around spying with such comprehensiveness and complex detail. The book also displays her characteristic subtlety, and close and fair-minded attention to other positions than her own.

She defines espionage as “the act of seeking to acquire information about third parties which is thought to be needed for the conduct of foreign policy, and which there are reasons to believe those parties would rather keep secret.” Certain activities of intelligence agencies are excluded from this focus, such as covert operations, and military assistance by intelligence agencies as well as spying activities by domestic law enforcement agencies, such as the police. Included, however, is counter-intelligence which she defines as “the act of protecting oneself from third parties’ espionage activities,” but it overlaps considerably with the treatment of espionage since the line between the two “is not hard and fast.”

In the space of this review, it will not be possible to summarise and assess thoroughly all the issues Fabre discusses, but the message of the book is a positive one about the moral value and importance of espionage operations in general. This justification, however, is contingent on the satisfaction of certain significant moral constraints. As she states it, “the book’s central thesis” is that “intelligence activities are morally justified (and sometimes mandatory) only as a means to protect oneself and third parties from violations of fundamental moral rights or risks thereof in the context of foreign policy writ large. More precisely put: intelligence activities are morally justified.” The final sentence here, though certainly precise, could be misleading in suggesting that intelligence activities are tout court justified, but by applying her criteria of justification she rules out as morally unjustified many actual cases of such activities. One category of this is the increasingly common intelligence activity of mass surveillance, certain crucial forms of which she rejects as morally unjustified in the last chapter of the book. So, less ambiguously, her message is “intelligence activities can be morally justified”. Her book then proceeds to chart when and how, with an important part of that exploration being interesting analyses of epistemic duties that are intimately involved with the moral justification of espionage activities.

Fabre begins with a chapter, “Building Blocks,” that explores classical and contemporary moral and political theory relevant to espionage and offers her own approach which makes many important distinctions and subtly elucidates moral and epistemic considerations related to her justificatory conditions. She then proceeds in later chapters to confront common criticisms against espionage, such as that it often enough must involve secrecy, deceit, including lying, treachery, and even treason, manipulation, coercion, exploitation, and unwanted surveillance. All these, with the possible exception of secrecy, labour under a more or less strong taint or presumption of immorality, which accounts for some of the traditional suspicion of and contempt for espionage, such as Immanuel Kant’s description of spying as an “infernal art.” She also discusses more technical aspects of modern espionage, especially technology and mass surveillance, and has a chapter on economic espionage.

Secrecy is easily dealt with initially since there are many occasions on which secrecy is morally neutral, morally permissible, or indeed a moral duty. In the contemporary world keeping secret one’s email passwords and other similar matters has no taint of immorality nor has police secrecy about the whereabouts of a protected witness who will testify against a vicious crime boss. Yet much political and governmental secrecy rightly raises a demand for transparency. Fabre agrees because revelations like those of Edward Snowden and Chelsea Manning show that “our governments all too often hide ongoing and past abuses under [the] cloak” of secrecy.   

She begins the grounding of her approach to justification by critically discussing three philosophical outlooks that seem relevant: social contract theory, just war theory, and dirty hands. She rejects various forms of contractarianism as fundamentally flawed for familiar reasons, just war thinking as too narrow to deal with espionage since espionage is not restricted to its role in ongoing warfare, but also to gaining information that can prevent war or achieve other important functions in peacetime. Dirty hands, she argues, is a relevant concept for explicating the moral issues of some espionage activities, but not others, including moral dilemmas and moral conflicts which are distinct from it. Instead she bases her “building blocks” on the concept of fundamental rights; as she puts it in her Epilogue: “espionage and counter-intelligence activities are morally justified as a means, but only as a means, to thwart violations of fundamental rights or risks thereof, subject to meeting the requirements of necessity, effectiveness and proportionality.” It is a striking feature of her approach to the application of this foundation that she goes beyond arguing for the permissibility of such activities to claiming some, perhaps many, of them as duties. As she notes, this stress on duties goes beyond more usual arguments for permissions, and can strike a problematic note. I am myself inclined to an adaptation of Ockham’s razor about duties: “never multiply duties beyond necessity.” Fabre’s duties, however, are standardly defeasible by various conditions, such as possibility of performance, and responsibility for self-protection, and that makes the move somewhat less startling.

Armed with this apparatus, Fabre explores many cases in which spying might involve morally contentious activities in order to delineate those that pass the test of moral permissibility, even duty, and those that don’t. Refreshingly, quite a few of those cases are, or are derived from, real life examples, contemporary or historical, but others involve imaginary dealings between officials or agents of nations Blue, Green, and Yellow in which Blue are usually the bad guys, Green the good, and Yellow somewhere in between. All of the treatments are subtly alert to complexities and can lead to surprising conclusions about moral permissions or duties. One example concerns the role of what she (and others) call “second best” moral considerations.

These come into play, for instance, when Fabre firmly denies regimes the right to use contentious espionage activities to discover the important secrets of a regime they have unjust designs upon, but qualifies this by allowing them to do so where this discovery would enable them to avoid harming innocent civilians of that nation. If Blue is planning an unjust war against Green it would be morally unjustified in spying on a suspected cyber facility of Green’s likely to be used against it (either as a pre-emption or in a later retaliation) with a view to destroying it. Nonetheless, Blue may be “second best” morally justified, indeed have a moral duty, to undertake the spying when it might lead to discovering that the facility is a civilian one and morally should not be targeted. That Blue’s spying reveals the facility to be civilian and thus enables Blue to refrain from attacking it is a sort of moral plus in Blue’s overall dark moral position in the matter.

One might think that Blue’s being both morally unjustified and morally justified in this act of espionage is close to a contradiction, but Fabre’s account of moral justification, both the permissive and the dutiful, is almost invariably accompanied by the reservation “pro tanto” or a similar phrase. So she could respond to the difficulty by saying that Blue’s situation is one in which Blue’s unjust cause puts it under a general pro tanto moral duty not to spy on Green’s cyber facilities in pursuit of that cause, but in context that duty is qualified by the duty to ascertain whether its target is civilian or military so that it will not commit the great wrong of gravely harming civilians and their significant infrastructure. Qualified but not entirely removed because, Fabre insists, the decision by Blue and its agents to proceed with the spying “though in one sense morally justified as a second best moral option, nevertheless is morally tainted” thereby showing “a moral asymmetry between intelligence agents on different sides of a conflict: some dirty their hands, while others keeps theirs clean.” Interestingly, this response shows how aspects of both Just War Theory regarding non-combatant immunity and also a version of Dirty Hands thinking can play important parts in Fabre’s discussion, despite the limitations she has earlier placed on them.

It is indeed possible that some nation or other political group bent on unjustly harming another, thus violating that other group’s fundamental rights, would balk at some such harms while inflicting others. Some revolutionary groups, whose revolution may well have been unjustified, have claimed that they went to considerable trouble to avoid directly harming innocent civilians while nevertheless attacking soldiers or police. In doing so, we can imagine them having used the debatable espionage methods, such as deception, bribery, exploitation and so on, to discriminate targets. Overall, however, our experience of contemporary politics and warfare, including sadly that practiced by democratic states, is that first worst (so to speak) unjust interventions have little prospect of being constrained by such partial, second-best duties. The deliberate or brutally negligent killing or maiming of non-combatants in the current Ukraine war is only the latest instance of tactics that have been practiced regularly since the city bombings by both sides in World War II. I suspect that the ingenious second-best defence will in practice have limited application to intelligence activities. At times Fabre concedes that she may seem to have provided too much moral leeway for the practitioners of spooking. So, she says in her Introduction “the book might give the impression of being too uncritical of intelligence agencies.” She responds by arguing that her justificatory conditions are actually quite stringent even to the point that “It is entirely possible—perhaps even likely—that much of what intelligence agencies have done, and are currently doing is morally wrong, at the bar of the account I defend here.”

A similar concern is addressed in her Epilogue when she says: “In some respects my defence of intelligence activities is quite permissive, by dint of the domain over which it applies and the means which it allows.” Against this she reiterates the demanding nature of her justificatory conditions.

She then adds in the Epilogue two concerns related to the above issue that she has “not properly tackled here” and are “thus unfinished business”. The first is about the ways in which certain criminal proceedings even in democracies routinely invoke national security as a ground for secrecy restrictions that violate basic principles of natural justice. Such trials are not only held behind closed doors but deny defendants full access to the evidence against them. The second is the problem that the continued practice of secrecy, lying, deceiving, manipulating, exploiting, coercing, and betraying, “may have deeply corrupting effects on those agents themselves.”

These points are well made, but I would add further dimensions that should also provide caution against too enthusiastic an endorsement of spying activities. To her first point about secrecy and the law, I would add that the term “national security” is not only abusively invoked for secrecy in legal cases, but more widely in many political contexts where it conveniently covers up political embarrassment, incompetence or wrongdoing, often enough under the guise of protected intelligence. As just one example, there is Colin Powell’s infamous misuse of flawed intelligence reports about Iraq’s “weapons of mass destruction” to invoke national (and international) security rhetoric for starting a disastrous war. Fabre, as noted earlier, briefly acknowledges that governments “all too often” use secrecy to cover up abuses, but the connection of this with the related abusive risks of secrecy allegedly required by intelligence agencies and the need for more publicly accountable independent scrutiny and control relevant to preventing them require further emphasis. As do better ways of protecting whistle-blowers.

The term “national security” itself is deeply problematic. It can be used, and often is, to denote things that do not involve the fundamental rights that are crucial to Fabre’s justification of various aspects of espionage. She discusses security primarily in the context of assessing its value in rejecting espionage incursions against individuals or communities, but national security is frequently invoked to defend espionage, and of course military, activities on behalf of one state against another or against other outsiders. She endorses Jeremy Waldron’s view that individual security involves more than physical safety, and includes, inter alia, “the protection of one’s basic mode of life and economic values.” She then extends this to the idea of community safety. The problem is that at any given time a nation’s conception of what “one’s basic mode of life” amounts to will very probably include morally indefensible elements which will figure in security justifications for various policies including those involving espionage. In my own country, the White Australia Policy was widely viewed from its inception in 1901 until its total abolition in 1973 as a bedrock feature of our “white” way of life, though it involved a racist violation of fundamental rights of large numbers of potential citizens. No doubt security services played some role in sustaining this under the flag of national security. And this is only one example among many that could be given. 

As for the second point about corrupting effects, a significant aspect of these can extend beyond individuals because the bonding phenomenon common to groups and institutions is even more pronounced in groups bound together by a commitment to secrecy and the power it gives. This ensures that the effects of a developing corruption of character are likely to be widespread and relatively immune to exposure. In so far as politicians are enmeshed in “the secret world” themselves, they too can suffer this sort of bonding corruption. Lord Acton’s famous remark: “All power tends to corrupt but absolute power corrupts absolutely” could well be amplified by the warning “Secret power tends to corrupt surreptitiously.”

A final thought about Fabre’s moral methodology. Like most contemporary moral philosophers, she makes extensive use of the “pro tanto” understanding of moral permissions and duties, and it is certainly important to recognise the ways in which many moral principles may need modification in application by considerations of context and circumstances. But, to my mind, there should be room for moral prohibitions that have no exception, though their terms might need interpretation in context. Fabre seems to agree in one case, namely the recruitment of children for espionage. She mentions it briefly among things she will not be dealing with and says “I take for granted (it) is morally impermissible.” I agree, but I wonder whether the consideration of dire imaginary circumstances in which some great evil is supposed to be avertable by such recruitment may not be produced to push that impermissibility into the “pro tanto” camp, as it has been by many philosophers in the discussion of the morality of torture.

Espionage institutions are now such an expanded, significant, and sometimes dubious part of our lives that a book as closely argued and thoroughly researched as Fabre’s will surely form a vital stimulus to future philosophical debate on this cloudy political area.