Squaring the Circle in Descartes' Meditations: The Strong Validation of Reason

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Stephen I. Wagner, Squaring the Circle in Descartes' Meditations: The Strong Validation of Reason, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 244pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107072060.

Reviewed by Georges Dicker, The College at Brockport: State University of New York


In order to defend Descartes against the charge of circularity, commentators often argue that his doubt is restricted in some way that exempts current clear and distinct perceptions from any doubt; for example, that it extends only to remembered clear and distinct perceptions (e.g., John Cottingham), or that it applies only to the general principle that whatever the meditator perceives clearly and distinctly is true (e.g., Anthony Kenny, Bernard Williams, James Van Cleve). In his unusual and provocative book, Stephen Wagner rejects such palliatives. He holds that Descartes' doubt is completely general, yet can be answered. He traces the doubt to Descartes's "creation doctrine" (usually called "the creation of the eternal truths") according to which God could have created everything, including the laws of mathematics and logic, in such a way that nothing corresponds to our clear and distinct perceptions, thereby opening an "epistemological gap" between our clear and distinct perceptions and the way things really are (3, 5, 126, 174, 228). Wagner believes that if this scenario is possible, then it cannot be ruled out by an appeal to clear and distinct perception. (But he does not indicate, as some commentators have, that even if God's omnipotence does not include control over the laws of logic and mathematics, this gap could still exist, since an omnipotent God could easily create our minds such that our clear and distinct perceptions failed to track the unalterable truths of logic and mathematics.[1]) Yet he maintains that this scenario can be ruled out (in a way that, if he is right, could be adapted to also rule out the skeptical scenario that turns on a less radical notion of omnipotence). How so? Wagner's answer is that it can be ruled out by having the experience of directly participating in God's thinking and creative activity. The meditator must come to know that he is participating in God's activity of thinking -- having God's very thoughts -- and he must obtain this knowledge without relying on logic or on clear and distinct perception, since their reliability is precisely what the deceiving God scenario calls into doubt.

Although Wagner never presents this line of thought as a formal argument, it could be summarized this way:

(1) When God clearly and distinctly perceives that p, God also wills p to be the case.

(2) When God wills p to be the case, God makes it true that p.

(3) When the meditator clearly and distinctly perceives that p, God clearly and distinctly perceives that p.

 When the meditator clearly and distinctly perceives that p, it is true that p.

Premise (1) is based on the view that Wagner calls the unity of God's understanding and will; (2) is based on the "creation doctrine." The crucial (3) is based on what I'll call Wagner's "participation thesis," for if the meditator participates directly in God's thinking, then obviously God and the meditator clearly and distinctly perceive the same things (if they clearly and distinctly perceive anything). The argument can be adapted to the less radical view of God's omnipotence, by omitting (2) and replacing "God wills p to the case" with "p is the case" in (1).

Wagner might well object that on his reading, Descartes cannot be relying on the above argument, since it uses logic. However, it seems to me that even if one grants the participation thesis, it alone cannot remove the doubt absent any use of argument, so that some reliance on logic is unavoidable. This point already threatens to ruin Wagner's solution to the problem of the circle, but I shall not dwell on it. Rather, I shall discuss the participation thesis on its own merits, but first let me say something about Wagner's other major interpretive proposals.

Unlike many scholars, Wagner does not interpret Descartes' Meditations as essentially a linear, deductive progression, where each conclusion is based partly on earlier conclusions. Rather, he sees each Meditation as having a three-stage structure that begins by setting a goal, develops arguments directed at but insufficient to attain that goal, and culminates in a "cognitive exercise" by which the goal is achieved. This way of reading the Meditations implies that Descartes was confused about his own method, for in the Synopsis of the Meditations he says, "the only order I could follow was that normally employed by geometers, namely to set out all the premisses on which a desired conclusion depends, before drawing any conclusions about it" (AT VII 13).

The goal of the First Meditation, we are told, is to induce suspension of judgment about all matters that depend on the existence of external things, including the reliability of the faculty of reasoning, which the meditator at this point thinks does so depend. But that goal is not attained by what Wagner sees as the self-undermining skeptical arguments of the Meditation's second stage; it is reached only by the "cognitive exercise" of imagining the evil demon in the third stage. This interpretation conflicts with the fact that just after advancing the deceiving God argument, but before introducing the imagined demon, Descartes says, "I have no answer to these arguments, but am finally compelled to admit that there is not one of my former beliefs about which doubt may not properly be raised" (AT VII 21).

The goal of the Second Meditation is to reach certainty about the meditator's existence and essence. Wagner holds that this goal is attained, but only in the sense of attaining psychological certainty (not absolute or "metaphysical" certainty), and that the Second Meditation's most important episode is not the cogito but, instead, the discovery of the meditator's power of clear and distinct perception, reached only in what he calls the "wax exercise." So, in contrast to the common understanding of Descartes's progress, Wagner holds that the cogito does not provide knowledge, but only "initial certainty" of one's existence (100). Thus, at the start of the Third Meditation, "the meditator has not yet established his own essence or existence" (150), and even before its third stage, where Descartes gives his second causal argument for God's existence and offers his "trademark" analogy, "The meditator has not yet discovered that he exists" (174). Further, Wagner rejects any inferential interpretation of the cogito, on the ground that the First Meditation doubts have called logical reasoning into question. He also offers a novel account of how the cogito yields even psychological certainty of one's existence: (a) the wax exercise shows that "thinking" means "causing ideas," (b) 'existing' means "exercising causal power," so (c) if I am thinking, I must exist.

I think Wagner is right to hold that anyone who thinks that the doubt extends to current clear and distinct perceptions -- in the sense that the meditator can doubt the truth of a proposition that was clearly and distinctly perceived at time t (and thus assent-compelling at t), and so must admit that the proposition may nevertheless have been false at t -- must face even the question of how thecogito can meet the charge of circularity. A virtue of Wagner's book -- indeed its chief virtue, in my opinion – is that he frequently reminds us of how radical the problem of the circle is. But it seems to me that his interpretation of the cogito still portrays it as an (unnecessarily roundabout) inference, and that it lacks textual support, especially as regards (b).

The final goal of the Third Meditation is to show that the clear and distinct perception of God's existence, rendered psychologically certain or assent-compelling by the casual proofs of his existence, is also metaphysically certain. This goal is not reached in the first causal proof, which rests entirely on the yet-to-be-validated "natural light," but in the second causal proof, at the end of which the meditator finally attains the experience of participation in God's thinking. Wagner admits that "Descartes never explicitly states that his validation of reason is achieved through the experience of participation that I have described" (24). He suggests, ingeniously, that Descartes kept the doctrine of participation under wraps to avoid "risking Church censure," just as he withheld publication ofle Monde (25-26)In order to "clarify the background and meaning of this idea of 'participation' in Descartes' thinking" (18), he devotes a section to expounding senses of 'participation' found in Augustine, Plato, Plotinus, and Aquinas (19-22). However, three of the notions of "participation" that he expounds -- the Platonic notion of many things having the same property by virtue of participating in one universal, the notion of an effect participating in a cause when its power is less than that of the cause, the notion of a quality participating in a given perfection by only partially exemplifying it -- seem too remote from the one he attributes to Descartes, and the fourth, the "beatific vision of the saints in heaven," described by Aquinas as "participation in God's own self-knowledge (still according to the finite mode of the intellect) by which God knows all created things directly, as their uncrated cause" (22) seems too mysterious, to "clarify" Wagner's interpretation.[2]

This brings me to my difficulty with Wagner's main thesis: Wagner's appeal to "participation" completely ignores the objection that is bound to occur to his readers: How can the meditator and God (or the meditator and any other mind) possibly have numerically the same thoughts? Even apart from the ontological framework that Descartes operates with, on which a thought is an instantiated property of a thinking substance and no single instance of the same property can belong to two different substances, this question seems quite impossible to answer. Presumably two minds can have the same thought in the sense of having thoughts with the same content -- e.g., two minds could both think "I think, therefore I exist" -- but that is not what Wagner needs, since a doubt could then easily be raised as to how the meditator can know without circular reasoning that his thoughts correspond to God's thoughts. Wagner could, I suppose, argue that one must here start from God's point of view, and that an all-powerful God could have the very thoughts that the meditator has, just as he could create a square circle. But then the meditator, since he has numerically some of the same thoughts as God, would have to be identical with God, which conflicts, among other Cartesian tenets, with Descartes's view that human minds are finite substances while God is an infinite substance. I suppose that if God could make a square circle, then God could also make it true that God has the meditator's very thoughts but is not identical with the meditator. But that seems to me to cross the bounds of sense. Be that as it may, my problem is not just that Wagner's interpretation attributes to Descartes a view that I find incoherent, but that he does not even address the obvious objection that it is at least prima facie incoherent.

As noted above, Wagner thinks that the meditator attains the experience of participation near the end of the Third Meditation, but for fuller explanation he draws on passages in Descartes's replies to Arnauld and Caterus where he tries to clarify his view that God is self-caused. Assuming for argument's sake that Descartes' clarifications are adequate, one may say, as Wagner does, that for Descartes, "the idea of God contains the power" of self-creation (170). From this claim, together with the claim that God cannot be a "secondary cause" (one that cannot by itself conserve anything else in existence), Wagner has Descartes conclude that

The power in the idea of God cannot be merely a representation of God's power; if it were, it would be a secondary cause. Rather, it must be God's power itself. So the meditator's experience of this power enables him to break out of the representational realm of ideas. In this way, he achieves the "face-to-face" awareness of God (170)

Wagner, not one to shun novel, even iconoclastic portrayals of Descartes's views (perhaps the most striking example being his claim that, according to Descartes, the meditator's existence is not contingent but necessary), goes on to derive this consequence:

The causal power which the meditator arrives at . . . is the objective reality of the idea of God. Since the power contained in the idea is self-creative, the meditator will not be able to distinguish the objective reality of this idea from some formal reality which is its cause. (170; cf. 167)

He adds later that the unity of God's will and understanding "is another way in which the meditator can recognize the collapse of the distinction between the objective reality of the idea of God and the formal reality of its cause" (174).

Again, I must demur. In the first place, it is unclear why, if the idea of God were merely a representation, it would be a secondary cause (what would it be helping to conserve in existence?), or a cause at all. Second, it is unclear why, even if the meditator were persuaded by the thought of God's self-causation that God exists, this would amount to experiencing or participating in God's power, as opposed to being convinced by grasping (or seeming to grasp) a particularly compelling argument. Third, the argument seems far from compelling anyway, because it is virtually identical with the "modal" version of the ontological argument that Descartes develops in his reply to Caterus, which, I believe, commits the fallacy of moving from the premise that necessary existence (which for Descartes is the same as self-caused existence) is contained in the definition or idea of God, to the conclusion that there really exists a being who answers to that definition or idea. I can see no good reason, either, to accept the alleged collapse of Descartes' distinction between the objective and formal reality of the idea of God. Indeed, I must add here, though I lack space to argue the point, that Wagner's treatment of Descartes's theory of ideas seems to me to contain a host of mistaken claims; for example, that "an idea is an image of the agent performing the act of thought rather than an image of the object thought about by that agent" (128), that ideas are "images of the activity of the powers that are causing the ideas" (129), and that "ideas themselves do not possess formal reality" (143).

The goal of the Fourth Meditation is to validate more generally the clarity and distinctness truth-rule. This can be done only after the source of error is discovered, at which point the essence of the mind as finite and fallible becomes known. Wagner says that only then can the meditator know his existence with metaphysical certainty, because Descartes subscribes to the scholastic principle that a thing's existence cannot be known before its essence is known. Wagner repeatedly calls this principle "Descartes's law of true logic." He seems to me to rely much too heavily on this principle, for he cites only one passage, in the reply to Caterus, where Descartes mentions it, and even there Descartes tells Caterus only that it is among "the laws of true logic" (CSM II 78; my italics). Besides, it is hard to know what to make of that remark. On the one hand, Descartes' progress in the Second Meditation, where he asks "what am I?" only after advancing the cogito, suggests that he does not really accept the principle, as do other Cartesian texts, including Discourse on the Method and Principles of Philosophy. On the other hand, the fact that he proves his existence from his thinking, and that thinking turns out to be his essence, suggest that in an important sense the knowledge of his essence does precede knowledge of his existence. Be that as it may, Wagner's point that no metaphysical certainty of either one's essence or one's existence can be had prior to dispelling the problem of the Circle must be reckoned with. I'll briefly address it at the end.

The goal of the Fifth Meditation, Wagner says, is not to provide further support for God's existence, but to "lead the meditator to translate his Meditation III experience of God's existence into deductive form" (215, cf. 156), where this means "leading the meditator to a more complete idea of God as a perfect being" (214) so that "the ideas of all other natures and their properties can be deduced from it. . . . and the meditator's innate idea of God is the single object of scientific knowledge" (221). These claims seem to me to be under-explained and quite extravagant. In a short concluding chapter, Wagner adds, "we should understand Spinoza's system as his completion of the demonstrations that Descartes grounded and began in Meditation V" (231). Wagner does not discuss the Sixth Mediationbecause he holds that the project of validating reason is fully solved by the end of the Fifth.

Apart from Wagner's apparent belief that the problem of the Circle must depend on Descartes's "creation doctrine," with which I disagree, I believe that his book shows a correct and deep understanding of the problem. But, as should now be obvious, I find his proposed solution very implausible.[3]

[1] Margaret Wilson, Descartes (Boston: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1978), pp. 33-34; Georges Dicker, Descartes: An Analytical and Historical Introduction (New York: Oxford University Press, 1993), pp. 136-137, 2nd Edition, 2013, pp. 168-170.

[2] The embedded quotation is from Thomas Aquinas, Summa Theologica, 60 vols. London: Blackfriars, 1964-1980), Ia. 12, 5, Vol. III, 190.

[3]For my solution to the problem of the Circle see DescartesAn Analytical and Historical Introduction, pp. 137-141 (pp. 170-176 in the 2nd Edition). To the best of my knowledge, no one has attacked it.