St. Paul Among the Philosophers

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John D. Caputo and Linda Martin Alcoff (eds.), St. Paul Among the Philosophers, Indiana UP, 2009, 195pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253220837.

Reviewed by Bill Martin, DePaul University



The more recent discussion of Paul is perhaps something akin to an “event” in Alain Badiou’s sense of the term: no one expected it. Seemingly out of nowhere there is a new philosophical discourse on Paul, and at least two groups of people are disturbed by it: the historians and religious studies scholars who are skeptical about the sorts of conceptual constructions contemporary philosophers might place on Paul’s words, and those who are not only wary of going another round with Christianity but especially with Paul, who is often associated with various retrograde tendencies in historical Christianity.

Why the “new Paul”? Paul seems an exemplary figure for considering the concepts of the event, fidelity, grace, truth, and what Badiou calls a “truth procedure”. Paul seems exemplary as a certain kind of “militant for truth”, even to the point where Slavoj Žižek makes an analogy between Jesus and Paul, on the one side, and Marx and Lenin, on the other. Additionally, there have recently been a series of deeper reflections on the philosophical profundity of Paul’s words and activism and the role of Paul’s specific activism in the Early Christian Movement. For that matter, there is ever more historical scholarship and investigation into Paul’s role, which for some time has been understood as decisive in the Early Christian Movement, not only for its direction, but even for its continued existence. The most “extreme” form of this argument is that there would have been no Christianity, as a distinct trend, without Paul. What is significant for present purposes is that it takes both philosophy and history to sort out this claim, but by the latter I don’t primarily mean historical investigation or historiography, but instead the actual, but contingent, unfolding of history. Perhaps the question that one is most concerned with at the end of the book is in fact the status of history, especially when it is clear that Badiou and Žižek are not overly concerned with historical detail.

St. Paul Among the Philosophers makes a vital contribution on at least two fronts. First among these is the discussion of what might be called the “new Christianity”, with work on the “new Paul” playing an important role within this. In addition to the work emanating from the “Radical Orthodoxy” trend and from figures such as John Caputo and Richard Kearney (contributors to the present collection), there is, furthermore, something to the idea that this “new Christianity” needs to be related to the political, if not entirely the intellectual, eclipse of liberation theology, and this is perhaps seen best in the notion that, just as Paul could be our contemporary “Lenin”, the “new Christianity” could also be the “new Marxism”, or, perhaps more to Badiou’s way of thinking, the “new communism”. St. Paul Among the Philosophers contributes crucially to this larger, and exceedingly complex, picture.

A second and very important contribution the collection makes, even if perhaps unintentionally, is to the understanding of the work of Badiou and Žižek, especially in light of a nicely-focused “application” of their work (to the meaning and significance of Paul) and in light of some questions that one would hope to see addressed to their work.

None of this is to say by any stretch that the contributions of the others in the collection (other than Badiou and Žižek, I mean) are not very important in their own right. They are, but what was especially appealing to me, as a philosopher and not a historian, is that the philosophers and historians who address important questions about historical study and interpretation and about problems of historiography and historicism are intellectual heavy-hitters who do a very good job of getting the questions right and developing these questions to the necessary depth. So, there is a great deal to learn from this volume in terms of the relationship between historical scholarship and the philosophy of history, and concepts such as event and eschatology, even if one is not especially interested in Paul or Žižek or Badiou or what is going on in recent intellectual work around Christianity.

What may appear strange to many who are not as familiar with Badiou’s work is that the differences between Badiou on the one side, and not only the historians but also some of the other philosophers on the other, ultimately boil down to the difference between ontology and epistemology.

The book opens with an excellent introduction by John Caputo, followed by essays from Badiou and Žižek. Caputo’s introduction has a provocative title that captures well two issues that reappear throughout the collection: “Postcards from Paul: Subtraction versus Grafting”. The first part of the title refers to the argument that Jacques Derrida had with Jacques Lacan, over what it means for a letter to reach its addressee. With Paul’s letters, to be sure, we cannot help but think (or at least it could be said that if we are not dogmatic fundamentalists we cannot help but think) about the curious structure of the New Testament, being made up for the greater part by letters, and the greater part of that by Paul’s letters. “Subtraction versus Grafting” goes to the question of the evental status of Paul’s fidelity: is the messiah crucified the opening to something new or an addition to something already present?

In this light, the structuring principle of the collection is that, for Badiou, Paul is the singular apostle of the new — then much of the book is a disagreement on this point, or on Badiou’s way of making this point, from the standpoint of historical and religious studies scholarship.

Žižek’s essay displays his usual brilliance and talent for provocation, but it has to be read at least twice, first for what it says about the book of Job and again for how this bears on the question of Paul. Discussion of Žižek is largely absent from the essays in the second part of the book, “Paul between Jews and Christians”, though Žižek himself is quite present in the roundtable that concludes the volume, which I think helps resituate the “new Paul” project within a larger project of a “new Christianity”.

While Žižek agrees with Badiou that there is no Christianity without Paul, he is also more willing to say that (transposing here) there is also no Lenin without the Bolshevik Party and the October Revolution. And it could be said that it is precisely here that the historians gain their traction, though Žižek and Badiou would say that this traction is gained at the expense of erasing the singularity of Paul (and Lenin).

Significantly, Badiou makes his claim about Paul as the singular apostle of the new not only in terms of philosophy but even more as a defining feature of philosophy and as a defense of philosophy. Apart from this perspective, the present volume could easily appear very strange and even incomprehensible to most philosophers and theologians, but especially to anyone of an historicist perspective. With varying degrees of philosophical sophistication, but always with a high level of historical sophistication and detail, the historical contextualizers in the book (everyone in the second part of the book other than Richard Kearney) are saying to Badiou, “we’re not buying it”.

This skepticism begins with not only Badiou’s rejection of historicism, but also with the lack of “content” that the contextualists see in Badiou’s Paul. Badiou’s claim is never to the contrary, of course; what we get from Paul is a “model” for fidelity to a truth event, and why would it matter at all to the model that its founding event did not actually happen? For all that this may seem crazy to a scholar oriented toward historical context, an argument can be made that there is a good deal more to this formalism than might at first meet the eye.

On the other hand, it is worth keeping in mind that both Žižek and Badiou are not only giving “new Christian” formulations, they are also combative toward a certain “new Jewish orthodoxy” that they associate especially with Levinas and to some extent Derrida. Significantly for the present discussion, both John Caputo and Richard Kearney have in general been very sympathetic to this “new Judaism”, as has been Daniel Boyarin, whose essay I find brilliant and worth the price of admission in and of itself.

In the first essay of the second part of St. Paul Among the Philosophers, Paula Frederiksen leads the charge of the historians: “Badiou proclaims the erasure precisely of [the] gap between Paris and Philippi, between the present and the past. ‘Paul,’ states that chapter’s title, is ‘our contemporary.’ Such a position is a hard sell to historians” (p.61). One of the valuable aspects of Frederiksen’s essay is its insistence on taking stock of the ontological consequences of different historicist approaches (she especially develops those of Origen and Augustine), which ought to remind us, at the very least, that in Badiou’s philosophy, taking mathematics as ontology is the result of a “decision”, and certainly there are good arguments for a different decision (for historicism).

The remainder of the historically-contextualizing essays in Part Two deepen this argument either in historical or philosophical terms or both. E. P. Sanders does not address Badiou directly, but instead makes it still harder for us to read Paul in de-historicized terms. Dale B. Martin presses this point further in the case of Paul and the idea of universalism, indeed crediting Badiou with showing the form of a universalism that is not dependent on a coming together of supposedly-distinct “peoples”, and deepening the argument that Paul’s conception of the “peculiar people” is not in any sense “ethnic”. At the conclusion of his essay, however, Martin begins a process of turning the corner on the “contentless” universalism of Badiou and Žižek that is more subtle, philosophically, than Frederiksen’s more straightforward (but valuable for that) demonstration of why we should not give up on historicism. One could say that Martin’s critique of Badiou’s formalism rebounds also against the latter’s universalism as well, and ultimately Martin is skeptical of contemporary reformulations of ethical-political universalism.

Daniel Boyarin goes further than the other contextualizers both in praising Badiou’s contribution and in demonstrating Paul’s philosophical background in sophism — a term that Boyarin uses affirmatively, in marked contrast to Badiou.

For Martin as for Fredriksen, Badiou’s project — and not only as it concerns Paul — is not sustainable, and though neither exactly puts it this way (but each comes close), this is because Badiou’s ontology does not seem to account for history (and this is a problem even if Badiou is not himself interested in the question). Put another way, both Frederiksen and Martin might argue that we can do well enough “within the constraints of epistemology”, and that we are stuck with these constraints in any case, and Badiou’s project of blasting through these constraints with “mathematics as ontology” doesn’t work. For Badiou, the twentieth-century problematics of language and interpretation (whether under the heading of continental hermeneutics or analytic philosophy of language) are part of an exhausted, Kantian, subject-centered paradigm.

Boyarin goes so far as to say that “contra a certain mood or tendency among Paul scholars, … Badiou is frequently enough a very good and close reader of Paul… . Badiou’s language of event and militance captures something about Paul’s texts … that more openly theological language misses” (p.112). Boyarin is especially concerned with the way that the question of law, which is crucial in Badiou’s understanding of Paul, plays out in Galatians 2: “by works of law shall no one be justified … if justification were through the law, then Christ died to no purpose” (quoted on pp.112-13).

A Badiouish reading of this passage makes sense of it in a way that nothing else can, in my view. There are deep flaws in Paul’s logic here, for there is nothing in what he says that disqualifies the Jacobean … idea that faith in Christ comes to add to the law and not to subtract it, that when Jesus says (as, to be sure, he will only say a generation after Paul) that he comes to fulfill the law, he means just that, to supply its meaning and fulfillment, to complete it, not to abrogate it. Keeping the law and having faith in Jesus Christ would not be, on that account, in any way contradictory, and, I repeat, there is nothing in Paul’s argument as it is usually understood that disproves such a theology. Badiou’s Paul, however, makes sense of this passage. Faith here does not mean believing in Christ, or even trusting in his faithfulness to us, in any conventional sense, but fidelity to the event of the absolute newness that has entered the world with the crucifixion. (p.113)

There is much to discuss in this passage alone, but the crucial point that I want to underline is that here we see the fundamental difference between Badiou and the historicists (or historical contextualizers, at any rate): it is entirely possible to interpret Paul as a “radical Jewish activist-thinker” or as “the first Christian, even more radical”. Both interpretations fit the facts, so to speak — this would appear to give us a classic case of what Quine called “ontological relativity”. But we cannot elude the fact that all of the historical-contextualizers, including Boyarin, come down on the side of Paul as radical Jew.

So then we have to look at the difference within the difference: what is necessary for the contextualizers is an epistemological and synthetic approach (where we can have both law and grace, in some measure where each is significant and one is not completely subordinate to the other), while Badiou is recommending an ontology that makes sense of the possibility of the new, and the development of the consequences of this ontology.

In the end we are left with a series of interrelated questions. Does mathematics allow us to circumvent questions of language, meaning, hermeneutics, and epistemology, at least for a crucial “moment”, a pure moment of the new? Is Paul truly the example for this pure moment, or is it instead the case that the only “Paul” who could be such an example is an absolutely pure, contentless, and certainly inhuman “Paul” who just as well might be given any other name for a non-existent person? It seems here that Badiou’s “truth” comes awfully close to a pure fiction! In Christianity, it would seem that, even apart from methodological questions of historicity we would need to be able to speak of, as Lenin put it, “intervention in history”, and clearly this is Badiou’s concern as well. Without the work of the contextualizers, however, it is unclear where we would connect with the history upon which the intervention occurs. Again, this is where the contextualist essays in St. Paul Among the Philosophers do us a great service, by showing very well what Badiou is up against in making a philosophical (even an ontological) example of Paul. However, on the other side, the question is whether this work of historicization effectively means that there is nothing new, there are no turning points in history, there is nothing that can (to cite a phrase from Nietzsche that Badiou has taken up) break the world into two.

Significantly, the last essay in the collection is from a philosopher, Richard Kearney, who discusses the Paul of Agamben and Badiou in terms of the interpretation of divine power as radical possibility or even as “possibilization” (under the conception that what is impossible for humans is possible for God). One interesting moment in Kearney’s argument occurs when he addresses Agamben’s notion of “bare life”, saying that this theory of the “impotential … borders at times on a morbid obsession with the dehumanized and disenfranchised” to such a degree that “one almost longs for more of Badiou’s militant universalism!” (p.154) Even here however, on this more straightforwardly philosophical terrain, one can wonder if Kearney’s extension of the notion of possibility serves to further Badiou’s notion of a fundamental break or merely to assimilate once again this rupture.

Badiou’s contributions to the roundtable, while only taking up about three pages, are well worth study, especially as he addresses Boyarin’s arguments head on and takes up Boyarin’s contestation of the term, “philosophy”. One would have wanted much more, of course, especially around the questions of history and historicity, and yet what Badiou says in his brief remarks is immensely helpful. For whatever reason, Badiou breaks off after these two interventions early in the roundtable (he may have had a plane to catch, for all I know), but then Žižek, as one would expect, comes roaring back in, and his comments serve to remind us once again that there is the question of Paul, but there is also the question of Christianity (and Judaism, for that matter, and from there Western monotheism, the existence of God, the meaning of this last question, and so on), without which we would be no more concerned with Paul than most people are concerned with various other controversial figures of the Early Christian Movement.

This is a very rich book, vibrating with possibilities. For my part, I cannot wait to explore all of these questions further, and I also hope to use the book in advanced undergraduate and graduate courses in the next year.