Stability and Justification in Hume's Treatise

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Loeb, Louis E., Stability and Justification in Hume's Treatise, Oxford University Press, 2002, 296 pp, $42.50 (hbk), ISBN 0195146581.

Reviewed by Saul Traiger, Occidental College


In this carefully crafted study of Book I of . Treatise of Human Nature, 1 Louis Loeb offers a refreshingly new interpretation of Hume’s account of the justification of belief. Loeb marshals substantial support for the view that Hume has a robust normative epistemology, an epistemology that can be understood in light of the sections of the Treatise traditionally taken as arguing for skepticism, and in light of the more genuinely skeptical themes of Part IV of Book I. Loeb’s work is a model of Hume scholarship. Loeb locates genuinely interesting and plausible positions in Hume’s writings, positions that have to be carefully culled from the text and analyzed. Hume’s metaphors are rich and suggestive, but they must always be tested in the vast and rocky terrain of Hume’s texts. If Loeb convinces the reader that for Hume, justified beliefs are those that have the characteristic of stability, he does so by taking the whole of Book I into account. Loeb is guided by interpretive coherence and the independent plausibility of the positions he discovers in Hume. His ultimate aim is to support a theory of justification based on the notion of stability, showing both how far Hume takes us towards such a theory, and where Hume’s account needs supplementation and amendment.

The book is divided into seven chapters. The first chapter introduces the project and sets out the key interpretive constraints. Loeb holds that there is a positive epistemological project in Part III of Book I of the Treatise but that Hume despairs of carrying out that project in Part IV. A “two-stage” interpretation is presented to account for the difference in the two parts of Book I. Hume’s account of justification, in Loeb’s view, is based on Hume’s assessment of the prospects for stable belief. While Hume endorses the view that justified beliefs are stable beliefs, he ultimately holds that stability in belief is not achievable for the reflective person. At the end of the first chapter Loeb provides an extremely helpful prospectus of the project, mapping out the book with an annotated list of no fewer than twenty-one theses. This is a great convenience , and readers will consult the prospectus often.

It is always appropriate in a work of this sort to place one’s effort in the context of other interpretations. Most often this takes the form of the author’s criticism of alternative approaches. While Loeb has a good deal to say about what he finds wrong with other interpretations of Hume, in this first chapter he refreshingly emphasizes the interpretations which anticipate or otherwise suggest the stability interpretation developed in the subsequent chapters. I can’t think of another work on Hume in recent years that so extensively draws from the relevant secondary literature. While Loeb is always focused on the Treatise, the notes are filled with careful and helpful discussions of matters of interpretation from the secondary literature.

The second, third and fourth chapters present Loeb’s stability interpretation of Hume’s theory of justified belief. Chapter II suggests the place of a theory of justification in Hume’s associationist project and in the context of Hume’s treatment of causation and causal inference. Chapters III and IV present the stability interpretation in detail. Here Loeb emphasizes important but neglected passages in the Treatise, including Hume’s treatment of education, the two systems of “reality” and “realities,” and the section of Part III entitled “Unphilosophical Probability”. In these chapters Loeb argues convincingly that Hume’s project is a normative one, that Hume formulates norms of justified belief. Loeb is among the few interpreters of Hume’s epistemology to suggest that Hume has something like a default reasoning account of justified belief. Justification is the default state for belief. One does not need to actively provide reasons in order to have justified belief. As long as a belief is not challenged by conflicting evidence, it is infixed, to use Loeb’s term, and thus justified. What has to be explained in a theory of justification is not how some beliefs get their justification but rather how others fail to have it. A stability account of justification fits nicely with this insight.

The final three chapters explicate some of the most important topics in Part IV of the Treatise. In this final part of Book I, Hume launches his attacks on the systems of both the ancient and the modern philosophers. If Loeb shows that Hume provides an account of justified belief in Treatise Part III, his approach to Part IV is to show that for Hume certain beliefs, including belief in material substratum, in the continued and distinct existence of perceptions, and in the soul, are not justified. Thus belief is the unifying feature of Parts III and IV of the Treatise, though it turns out that, for a reflective person, there is no stable outcome.

In the limited space of a review I cannot take up all of the interesting controversies that this fascinating book will stimulate for those who study Hume’s epistemology as well as for contemporary epistemologists with some historical leanings. In what remains I will address some of the issues that arise in the Loeb’s treatment of Hume’s positive theory of justification. One observation, however, applies to the approach Loeb takes in the last three chapters. It concerns the pervasiveness of belief as the central subject of Book I. On Loeb’s interpretation, the items treated in Part IV, such as material substratum and continued and distinct existence, are beliefs. What could be made clearer is the fact that, for Hume, these items only take on the status of belief in philosophical systems. The same fiction-generating mechanisms function in the vulgar as well as in philosophers. But in the case of the vulgar such mechanisms do not generate unstable belief. Is this just because the vulgar are unreflective? It seems rather that for Hume, continued and distinct existence and the self function as stable conceptual underpinnings of ordinary belief and they do so without counting as beliefs. In his famous example of the porter, Hume says that we “suppose” the continued existence of perceptions in order to make sense of our experience, by connecting past and present perceptions, and then he contrasts these suppositions with beliefs which are the outcome of causal reasoning (T, 21; SBN 195-6).

Another instance of Loeb’s tendency to extend the notion of belief can be found in his discussion of memory. Loeb freely refers to “memory beliefs.” But Hume never uses that term. The closest Hume comes to treating memories as beliefs is found where he writes of “the belief which attends our memory” (T; SNB 154). Even in this passage he is merely comparing memories with belief in terms of vivacity. There is still a distinction to be made between them. Clearly memories are analogous to beliefs. Like beliefs, they are high vivacity ideas. But Hume generally restricts belief to the results of causal inference, and in doing so emphasizes the mechanism which brings about the high-vivacity idea more than the occurrent properties of the perception.

That said, Loeb goes to considerable effort to craft an interpretation of Hume’s theory of belief which emphasizes its dispositional character rather than the occurrent properties of belief. Beliefs are “steady dispositions to display characteristic manifestations” (p. 102). Such a reading appears to run counter to Hume’s explicit definition of belief as “a lively idea related to a present impression” (T; SNB 98). Loeb does not deny that there are belief-related lively ideas. On his view these lively ideas are manifestations of the steady dispositions. While interpreters may disagree about whether it is appropriate to refer to the lively-idea-forming mechanisms as beliefs or simply call them belief-forming mechanisms, Loeb is surely right that this is where the normative action is. If mere liveliness conferred justification, then Hume would not be in any position to criticize the effects of education, poetical enthusiasm or superstition, since those effects can also be high-vivacity ideas.

In Chapter IV Loeb looks closely at a number of passages which have not received a great deal of attention by Hume scholars. In one such passage Hume describes a case of situated cognition, the case of someone hung out over a precipice in an iron cage. In spite of the evidence of safety, Hume notes that a person suspended in such a cage can’t help feeling fear when glancing at the precipice below (T; SNB 148). Here the stable disposition to have high vivacity ideas of one’s safety is potentially dislodged by the circumstances. Loeb is certainly correct to see this example as a case of potentially destabilizing conflict. But Loeb sees the conflict as one between accidental generalizations (the circumstance of being hung out over a precipice) and genuine regularities (well fastened chains keep iron cages from falling). This passage, however, picks up on precipice examples discussed by Montaigne, Pascal, and Malebranche, and it is intended to show the destabilizing effect of the direct passion of fear on belief. Hume’s description of the case makes explicit the role of vivacity-enhancing mechanisms that strengthen the feeling of fear and lead to a destabilization of belief. These observations are not incompatible with Loeb’s general theses but suggest that there are further resources in Hume, particularly in Hume’s treatment of the direct passions, for making sense of the belief-destabilizing features of the mind.

In the normal run of life an epistemic agent, even a relatively unreflective one, will experience belief-destabilizing situations such as precipices. Unreflective persons, however, will not confront the destabilizing effects from conflicting evidence as often as the reflective person, and thus will have wider ranging dispositions to stable belief than reflective persons. Does this mean that the unreflective person has a belief system that is in some sense more justified than that of the reflective person? As Loeb notes, that depends on whether justification is understood as stability for any fully-reflective person or as stability relative to the belief-forming mechanism of the epistemic agent. Loeb argues that Hume’s notion of stability conforms to the second of these two stability notions, and therefore the vulgar are indeed more justified than are reflective persons. This sets up Loeb’s interpretation of the skeptical themes in Part IV, where Hume despairs of finding a stable epistemic position for the fully reflective individual. While many philosophers have noted that Hume recognizes the value of common life, Loeb’s bold interpretation of Hume’s epistemology provides one plausible underpinning for that view.

While I have emphasized the richness of Loeb’s treatment of Part III of Book I of the Treatise, the final three chapters grapple with some of the most difficult passages in Part IV. Engagement with these chapters is equally rewarding. Here Loeb stretches out a bit, developing difficulties for Hume’s views, as well as considering amendments that might resolve those difficulties. Perhaps the greatest strength of the book is its success in providing an overall interpretation that makes sense of both Hume’s positive account of belief and justification in Part III, and his skeptical turn in Part IV.


1. David Hume, A Treatise of Human Nature, ed. David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton (Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press, 2000). Hereafter abbreviated “T” with book, part, section and paragraph numbers inserted parenthetically in the text. References abbreviated “SBN” give the corresponding page numbers in the Selby-Bigge/Nidditch version: David Hume, A Treatise of Human Nature, ed. L. A. Selby-Bigge, 2nd ed., revised by P. H. Nidditch (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1978).