Stain Removal: Ethics and Race

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J. Reid Miller, Stain Removal: Ethics and Race, Oxford University Press, 2017, 204pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190280970.

Reviewed by Naomi Zack, University of Oregon


Martin Luther King Jr.'s dream that someday African Americans would be judged by the content of their characters and not the color(s) of their skins has to the present set the moral standard for attitudes and behavior involving racial difference. For instance, in Buck v. Davis, the U.S. Supreme Court recently ruled inadmissible a psychologist's assessment at sentencing that the defendant would be statistically likely to commit further crimes, because he was black. The Court's ruling was based on the presumption that racial stereotypes cannot be used as evidence in a court of law. Indeed, the application of group statistics to individual cases is not sound prediction and many would consider the Court's ruling here as an astute identification of contemporary racism as practiced by officials in many contexts.

Along these lines, when J. Reid Miller argues that race is a stain on ethics and ethics is a stain on race, some readers will assume that he is engaging in a second-order discourse, via phenomenology and historical analyses of myths and signs. That is, it will be assumed that Miller really does, deep down, agree with King and that he would approve of the Buck v. Davis ruling. That the first, at least, is not altogether clear from Miller's text, will support much interesting controversy among moral philosophers and philosophers of race, particularly methodological disagreement. Thus, concerning the project of revealing "hidden racism" and advising "how to end it,", Miller writes:

The reader is hereby notified -- where "notified" signifies simultaneously "reassured" and "warned" -- of the criminal intentions of this book: that it will satisfy neither of these expectations. It will not concede the inferiority of "myth" to "reality" as if debunking myths is the task that falls to scholars not fortunate enough to be culling empirical "realities" in well-funded labs. It does not pretend to reveal a dangerous "fiction" that holds a multitude of us in subjugated bondage. . . (p. 25)

Miller begins by claiming that there cannot be an ethics of race because an ethics of anything presupposes that its subject can be perceived or correctly described in some "factual" or value-neutral way, because it is "outside" of ethics. But race is already evaluative (evaluated) throughout the modern period, beginning systematically in philosophy with Kant's ordinal (ranked, with whites first) taxonomy of human races. Miller's insistence that race is already inexorably evaluative is based on his emphasis of the importance of myths about the transfer of value through heredity and physical embodiment. Physical embodiment is the object of perception, so that racial identities are what Bernard Williams has called "prejudicial objects."

Miller claims that value-laden myths about race have criminalized some human bodies in a tradition of "blessing and curses." By contrast, and in opposition, Enlightenment ideas about moral responsibility made it possible for individual autonomy in a single lifetime -- the individual creates her own fate through choices. Ethics is thereby born, but only in opposition to the tradition of hereditary blessings and curses. And the ethical tradition of individual responsibility requires the tradition against which it reacted, as well as those who remain identified with the "blessing and curses" tradition, that is, racialized "others."

Miller outlines these core ideas in his Introduction. In chapter 1, he argues that ethical emphases on deeds neglect accompanying evaluations of the agent. Chapter 2 considers how subjectivity could be "reconfigured" in terms of affiliative relations that transfer value, when awareness of what is determined could operate as a "circuit breaker" on the forces determining value (pp. 77-8). Chapters 3 and 4 are an analysis of ancient Greek and early Christian thought about the origination of value and ethical knowledge as part of the natural world. Here, Miller shows how value first emerged after action was deemed criminal, a structure that is proto-typical for the historical emergence of race. Miller's Conclusion is not a "happy ending," because ethical inheritance still dominates the subject seeking freedom and nothing, not even a reversal of existing racial power structures, can undo the past. Miller endsĀ  with a passage by James Baldwin which expresses a tension between acceptance of cursed/criminalized inheritance in the first paragraph and a thirst for vengeance in the second:

The custodian of an inheritance, which is what blacks have had to be, in Western culture, must hand the inheritance down the line. So, you, the custodian, recognize, finally that your life does not belong to you: nothing belongs to you. This will not sound like freedom to Western ears, since the Western world pivots on the infantile, and, in action, criminal delusions of possession, and of property. . . .

But the people of the West will not understand this until everything which they now think they have has been taken away from them. In passing, one may observe how remarkable it is that a people so quick and so proud to boast of what they have taken from others are unable to imagine that what they have taken from others can also be taken from them. (p. 171)

The controversy I predicted at the start of this review is unlikely to unite moral philosophers and philosophers of race, because both traditional moral philosophers and progressive anti-racist philosophers will recognize a fundamental criticism of their entire enterprise in this work. Enigmatic questions are raised for both groups of scholars: Is race such a fundamental category of human existence that it overrides basic assumptions about how we can develop our characters and regard others? Can the historical contingency of race override the more important concerns and projects involving character development and assessment? How does the importance of what we now take to be ethical concerns and projects compare with the power of the value-imbued ontology of race?

If race is already embedded in racial ontology, why is it not possible to resolve that circularity through careful analysis that recognizes this problem, without seeking to purify racial ontology as it is commonly taken to be? Philosophers of race might already recognize the morally bad aspects of race throughout history and advocate mourning and memorial, as well as resolve to resist the morally bad aspects of race in their own discourse. In fact, most philosophers of race who seek to retain racial categories proceed exactly in that way. Similarly, ethicists could take special care to cultivate awareness of how their moral prescriptions and systems exclude or already criminalize nonwhites. Although, as noted, Miller claims that the enterprise of ethics is impossible without nonwhite racial others who are already considered morally bad or not qualified to be ethical subjects or objects, he has given little support for this sweeping assertion. Surely, the abolitionist movement against slavery, white supporters of the U.S. civil rights movement, and international humanitarian discourse disturb that generalization, if only as an empirical matter. Finally, although Miller resists addressing race as racism, it is difficult to understand how his analysis of race as a stain that cannot be removed from ethics and his analysis of ethics as ineradicably white (or not nonwhite) does not amount to deep analysis of anti-nonwhite racism.

Miller's book is a short, dense, brilliant, and fascinating work that is very important for its historical and phenomenological depth of analysis. Miller's analysis proceeds by unveiling or positing a horrible but compelling prophecy that to remove ideas of nonwhite race as curse would also remove the need for ethics. The question is whether there would be interest in taking responsibility if some individuals were no longer burdened by hereditary criminalization. The illogic of this question, that A is motivated to be ethical because B is not ethical, is alleviated if those "others" so burdened are recognized as projections of the ethical self -- that is, criminalized B is a projection of ethical A. Still, removing the need for ethics by removing what it is a rebellion against, namely the tradition of determined badness or criminalization, does not necessarily preclude some people from gratuitously choosing to be good. That already happens when ethics is purely secular and some are kind.