Stanley Cavell and the Claim of Literature

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David Rudrum, Stanley Cavell and the Claim of Literature, Johns Hopkins University Press, 2013, 285pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781421410487.

Reviewed by Gerald Bruns, University of Notre Dame


Stanley Cavell belongs to a generation of Anglo-American philosophers -- D. Z. Phillips, Martha Nussbaum, Alasdair MacIntyre, among others -- who took a more than recreational interest in literature. What exactly is the nature of Cavell's interest? That, basically, is the regulating question of David Rudrum's study, whose chapters are devoted to Cavell's writings on Thoreau, Shakespeare, Wordsworth, Poe, and Ibsen. And in the bargain we get a Cavellian reading of a text that Cavell seems not to have taken up: Arthur Miller's Death of a Salesman, with its themes of the ordinary and the tragic -- tragedy, moreover, that is distinctively American (not, for once, a fall of the mighty).

Rudrum begins, however, by carefully separating Cavell from anything resembling academic literary study, with its critical methods, poststructuralist theories, and diverse cultural agendas -- gender studies, ethnic studies, queer theory, and so on. To put the matter as simply as possible, for Cavell a literary work is (after Wittgenstein) a "form of life." There is no "approach" to it -- no structuralist program of analysis that will lay bare its operations and results. It is something one learns to inhabit. One finds one's way around in it the way one gains fluency in a language. Naturally something like "receptivity" or "attunement" is a condition, but eventually one grows familiar with Shakespeare's texts, or Beckett's, even when -- or, paradoxically, especially when -- they sometimes set severe limits to our capacity for elucidation.

Naturally a difficulty arises as to whether a philosopher can inhabit such a form of life without a fugitive's sense of alienation. A Cavellian might answer that, being made of words, philosophy and literature are not mutually exclusive but interpenetrate one another -- sometimes smoothly, as when the philosopher William Gass writes novels, and sometimes critically, as when a philosopher confronts the question (as Cavell did early in his career in his encounter with the texts of Wittgenstein): "What is philosophy? How is it to be written?"[1] As if the answer to the first question were entailed in the answer to the second -- a perilous prospect, especially if one takes Wittgenstein at his word: "Philosophy ought to be written only as a poetic composition [dichten]."[2] On this matter one is apt to find oneself in a conflict between tradition and "the modern," which Cavell characterizes as that "moment in which history and its conventions can no longer be taken for granted" (MWxxii). After all, when forms of life become institutionalized (impositions of "official culture"), they provoke efforts of escape, except perhaps among those who seek safe havens, as when the atonality of modern music helped to move Cavell from a career as a composer to a life as a philosopher -- without, however, making himself entirely recognizable philosophically.[3] He has remained, until perhaps recently as he nears the end of a celebrated career, a creature of the between, outside of categories, distinctions, and the rule of identity. Which no doubt helps to explain why Cavell from first to last has confounded consecutive thinking in order to satisfy his "craving for parentheses" (MWx), or what in poetic contexts is called "open form," serial writing that is irreducible to generic, much less disciplinary, expectations.

One of the virtues of Rudrum's book is that he addresses at once the matter of Cavell's writing, which he does not hesitate to characterize as "modernist" in the sense of "experimental," that is, open to if not in fact forcing the question, "What is it?"[4] In his forward to The Claim of Reason Cavell says that his "fascination with the Investigations had to do with my response to it as a feat of writing" (CRxiii).[5] But what is interesting is that Cavell's experiment in writing was not simply to find in Wittgenstein an alternative to philosophy's traditional logic of argumentation. On the contrary, it was to break with Wittgenstein's "modernism," namely the fragmentary mode of Bemerkungen. Cavell writes:

I have found the Investigations, I suppose more than any other work of this century, to be paradigmatic for me, to be a dominating present of the history of philosophy for me. This has meant, as these things will, living with the sound of it, subjected to the sound. To find a certain freedom from that sound was therefore necessary if I was to feel I was finding my way to an investigation of my own preoccupations. This in practice meant discovering ways of writing which I could regard as philosophical and could recognize as sometimes extensions -- hence sometimes denials -- of Wittgenstein's, and of course also of those of any other writer from whom I make my way (CRxiv-xv; my emphasis).

Note that Cavell characterizes his relation to the Investigations in terms of the materiality of its language -- of living with and being subjected to its sound, and of getting out from under such subjection, not by attending to something else in the text (its meaning, for example, or its aboutness), but by finding alternative ways of writing, of which the citation above provides an example, sounding as it does after all as much like a spoken as a written text, given to enlargement, interruption, and multiple directions, as if going (like Emerson's thinking) wherever a whim takes it.[6] But how can one regard this way of writing as philosophical?

In one of his later works, A Pitch of Philosophy, Cavell insists that doing philosophy does not mean giving up, among other things, one's musical ear, nor one's idiosyncratic voice, even if it does entail writing outside the "language game" of formal philosophy.[7] And in his book on Emerson, Conditions Handsome and Unhandsome (CH), Cavell writes:

If, as professional philosophers, we were asked whether philosophizing demands of us anything we would think of as a style of writing, our answer, I guess, would waver, perhaps because our philosophical motivation in writing is less to defend a style than to repress style or allow it only in ornamental doses (CH34-35).[8]

In place of repression, which closes things down, Cavell prefers the "provisional," or leaving things in the air. In one of his many self-reflexive moments, he writes:

About my own sound it may help to say that while I may often leave ideas in what seems a more literary state, sometimes in a more psychoanalytic state, than a philosopher might wish -- that is, that a philosopher might prefer a further philosophical derivation of ideas -- I mean to leave everything I will say, or have, I guess, ever said, as in a sense provisional, the sense, that is, to be gone on from (CH33).

Imagine the sound of someone thinking out loud . . . 

As Rudrum's book shows, the "provisional" applies to Cavell's relation to literature as well as to philosophy; that is, his writings on Thoreau and others are not so much "readings" in the sense of grasping a sense or meaning of a text as they are ethical-poetic engagements -- what Gadamer once described as seeing oneself in light of the text, recognizing that, if one is to understand at all, one has to change, however uncertain the consequences may be.[9] But more specifically it means engaging the words themselves, their sound and their look as well as their function or, better, their "performance" as they act upon us. In The Senses of Walden, Cavell writes:

My subject is nothing apart from sensing the specific weight of these words as they sink; and that means knowing the specific identities of the writer through his metamorphoses, and defining the audiences in me which those identities address, and so create; and hence understanding who I am that I should be called upon in these ways, and who this writer is that he takes his presumption of intimacy and station upon himself (SW 11-12).[10]

Emmanuel Levinas's ethical theory is dominated by the figure of the face and its anarchic claim on our responsibility for the welfare of others. By contrast, Cavell's reflections are informed by the claim made by words, as if our world and others in it were made of words, whose ethical task (as dramatized, for example, in Shakespeare's tragedies) is to defeat our obliviousness or doubt of the world and to acknowledge our undoubted separateness from one another (MW269-70).

Indeed, as Rudrum shows in a particularly fine chapter ("How To Do Things With Wordsworth"), Cavell retrieves the romantic conception of language as energeia, where language is not a system for framing representations but an activity of world-making that brings mere things to a life of articulation to which poetry, and literature more generally, finds itself under an obligation to respond. Of Thoreau Cavell writes that his "readings of nature do not feel like moralizations of it, but as though he were letting himself be read by it, confessed in it, listening to it, not talking about it" (SW99; my emphasis).[11] Nothing here of the disengaged punctual ego exercising conceptual control -- and likewise, for Cavell, our relation to language is not instrumental but ethical to the extent that one is, before anything else, responsive or available to the sound and look of it as well as to its performative possibilities.

This comes out in Rudrum's chapter, "What Did Cavell Want of Poe?," where Poe's story, "The Imp of the Perverse," is something like a parody of Descartes' Meditations that turns the cogito on its head -- Cavell himself thinks of it as "a kind of negation or perversion of the cogito" (IOQ123). Accordingly, one's reading of Poe's story, if one reads responsibly, is less a project of exegesis than a participation in, among other things, what Cavell takes to be its impish wordplay:

The fact of language it [Poe's story] illustrates is registered in the series of imp words that pop up throughout the sixteen paragraphs of the tale: impulse (several times), impels (several times), impatient (twice), important, impertinent, imperceptible, impossible, unimpressiveimprisoned, and, of course, Imp. Moreover, imp. is an abbreviation in English for imperative, imperfectimperial, import, imprimaturimpersonalimplementimproper, and improvement. And Imp. is an abbreviation for Emperor and Empress. Now if to speak of the imp of the perverse is to name the imp in English, namely as the initial sounds of a number of characteristically Poe-ish terms, then to speak of something called the perverse as containing this imp is to speak of language itself, specifically English, as the perverse. (IOQ124)

The basic fact of language (and hence of poetry and literature generally) is what Plato, and many after him, warned us against, namely its demonic materiality. Language is not simply signs and rules for their combination; it is made, as Cavell says, of "word imps," which logic, linguistics, and philosophies of language work to obliviate, but which it is part of Cavell's philosophical task (or obsession) to restore to their everyday place:

When we do note these cells or molecules, these little moles of language (perhaps in thinking, perhaps in derangement), what we discover are word imps -- the initial, or it may be medial or final, movements, the implanted origins or constituents of words, leading lives of their own, staring back at us, calling upon one another, giving us away, alarming -- because to note them is to see that they live in front of our eyes, within earshot, at every moment. (IOQ125)

As Rudrum suggests, a passage like this one -- and, indeed, Cavell's work taken as a whole -- "raises more questions than it answers" (133), but one could say that the passage goes to the heart of the claim that literature (and not just literature, but philosophy as well) makes on us. To be sure, one would expect the philosopher (in stark contrast to the poet) to counsel skepticism or, as Cavell would say, "avoidance" with respect to the materiality of words. But for Cavell this would be to deny life to language, which in the sheer perversity of its "word imps," its autonomy confronts us with a choice comparable to what Cavell in an early essay ("Music Discomposed") calls "the imperative choices we have when confronted with a new development in art" (MW196). Such developments do not simply bemuse us, as if from an aesthetic distance; on the contrary,

we are concerned with them, and care about them; we treat them in special ways, invest them with a value which normal people otherwise reserve only for other people -- and with the same kind of scorn and outrage. They mean something to us, not just the way statements do, but the way people do. People devote their lives, sometimes sacrifice them, to producing such objects just in order that they will have such consequences; and we do not think they are mad for doing so. (MW197-98)

"They mean something to us as people do." As if the materiality of "word imps," like the strangeness of the modernist artwork (think of Duchamp's Fountain, or John Cage's music), were continuous with "the problem of others" with which Cavell engages in what is perhaps his most compelling piece of philosophical writing, the fourth part of The Claim of Reason, where he finds himself "pushed to pieces of literature to discover the problem of the other" (CR476) -- in this case Shakespeare's Othello, which is a tragedy about the refusal to accept what is outside of us ("He cannot forgive Desdemona for existing, for being separate from him, outside, beyond command, commanding, her captain's captain" [CR491]). One can't help thinking here of Descartes and his body, whose nonexistence he is happy to imagine.

A final point in this connection would concern the question of theatricality, specifically our relation to characters on stage, acting a part (Lear, Othello). Rudrum devotes only a few pages to this question, but they are well taken, for basically the question is whether this theatrical relation undergoes anything like a metamorphosis from the aesthetic, where we are disinterested observers of a passing show, to the ethical, where the characters exert a claim on us analogous to the claim of the Levinasian Other, or what Cavell calls a claim upon our acknowledgment of them as persons. Cavell devotes a number of complex paragraphs to this question in his essay on King Lear (MW313-40), where he imagines, for example, a yokel leaping on stage to save Desdemona from Othello's throttling (MW327-29). The yokel is a joke, and yet, even so, he is not wrong.[12] We are as present to those on stage as he is, involved in the catastrophe, knowing (acknowledging) what he knows, but the conventions of theater restrain us from intervening -- call it an aesthetics of avoidance that, paradoxically, teaches us (makes us feel) the form that ethical responsibility or acknowledgment would otherwise take:

But doesn't the fact that we do not or cannot go up to them just mean that we do not or cannot acknowledge them? One may feel like saying here: The acknowledgment cannot be completed. But this does not mean that acknowledgment is impossible in a theater. Rather it shows what acknowledgment, in a theater, is. And acknowledging in a theater shows what acknowledgment in actuality is. For what is the difference between tragedy in a theater and tragedy in actuality? In both, people in pain are in our presence. But in actuality acknowledgment is incomplete, in actuality there is no acknowledgment, unless we put ourselves in their presence, reveal ourselves to them. We may find that the point of tragedy in a theater is exactly relief from this necessity . . . (MW332-33)

A convention of criticism says that tragedy exposes us to the characters on stage in a way that comedy does not (which is why, in comedy, we enjoy the freedom of laughter). Cavell's point is that we are as exposed to these characters as we are to other persons (CR432). Or, as he otherwise expresses it: we find ourselves exposed to our own humanity, and the task is how to recognize and act upon this fact about ourselves (CH439). Tragedy shows (as if we didn't know) the difficulty of this task, the pity that attends our failure.

[1] Must We Mean What We Say? (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1976), xxiii. Hereafter, MW.

[2] Culture and Value, trans. Peter Winch (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1980), 24e.

[3] One of Cavell's earliest philosophical projects was an effort to come to terms with the dissonance of the "new music" (the work of John Cage perhaps excepted). See "Music Discomposed" (MW180-212).

[4] See T. W. Adorno, Aesthetic Theory, trans. Robert Hullot-Kentor (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1997),121: "The better an artwork is understood, the more it is unpuzzled on one level and the more obscure its constitutive enigmaticalness becomes. It only emerges demonstratively in the profoundest experience of art. If a work opens itself completely, it reveals itself as a question and demands reflection; then the work vanishes into the distance, only to return to those who thought they understood it, overwhelming them for a second time with the question 'What is it?'"

[5] The Claim of Reason: Wittgenstein, Skepticism, Morality, and Tragedy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1979).

[6] In his recent autobiography, Little Did I Know (Excerpts from Memory) (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2010), Cavell speaks of philosophy's "tapping the willingness to start again, to go back over one's expressions, leaving nothing standing" (305). Meanwhile of Emerson Cavell says that "mastering his text is a matter of discerning the whim from which at each word it follows." See "Being Odd, Getting Even," In Quest of the Ordinary: Lines of Skepticism and Romanticism (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1988), 116. Hereafter, IQO.

[7] A Pitch of Philosophy: Autographical Exercises (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1994), 13-17.

[8]Conditions Handsome and Unhandsome: The Constitution of Emersonian Perfectionism (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1990). See also Cavell's This New Yet Unapproachable America: Lectures after Emerson after Wittgenstein (Albuquerque: Living Batch Press, 1989), 116: "How can philosophy -- in the form of the call for philosophy -- look like Emerson's writing?"

[9] See Gadamer, Truth and Method, 2nd rev. ed., trans. Joel Weinsheimer and Donald G. Marshall (New York: Crossroad Publishing, 1989), esp. 310-11; and Cavell, "The Politics of Interpretation (Politics as Opposed to What?)," Themes Out of School: Effects and Causes (San Francisco: North Point Press, 1984), 51, where the "scene of interpretation" is described as a situation "of reading and being read."

[10] (San Francisco: North Point Press, 1981).

[11] In "An Emerson Mood," Cavell says that "my relation to the existence of the world, or to my existence in the world, is not given in words but in silence" (SW145)—echoing here Heidegger's idea that "the poet's work is only a listening." See Heidegger, "Language in the Poem," On the Way to Language, trans. Peter Hertz (New York: Harper and Row, 1971), 188.

[12] Compare Cavell's anecdote of an encounter with an automaton who is so much like a human being that "it" can feel fear when threatened with a knife: "Do I intervene?" (CR405).