Stanley Cavell and the Education of Grownups

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Naoko Saito and Paul Standish (eds.), Stanley Cavell and the Education of Grownups, Fordham University Press, 2012, 262pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823234745.

Reviewed by Stanley Bates, Middlebury College


Stanley Cavell's influence on a variety of contemporary fields continues to grow. It has been marked, in the past decade or so, by a number of distinguished anthologies in a wide range of disciplines including politics and literature.[1] It is heartening for those of us who think that this influence is overwhelmingly (though, perhaps, not universally) positive to have witnessed the continuing (re)discovery of his work, and its significance for American Studies, Film Studies, Shakespeare studies and, of course, for what should be its home country, philosophy. (Whether academic philosophy as presently constituted in American and British universities is home country for Cavell is a continuing topic in much of this literature and in much of Cavell's own writing.)

The relevance of Cavell's thought to reflection on education should be obvious, since it is implicit in all of his writing including his interpretations of the opening of Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations, and his discussion of, e.g., the "scene of instruction." Moreover the title of the work under review is drawn from Cavell's explicit characterization of philosophy as the education of grownups in the concluding paragraphs of Part I of The Claim of Reason.[2] Perhaps the lack of interest in thinking of Cavell on this topic is related to the negligible place of philosophy of education in most departments of philosophy. Philosophy of education has been primarily pursued in departments, programs, and schools of education, and in those places it also has a somewhat tenuous position. Academic programs in education tend to be primarily concerned with issues about schooling, and the preparation of teachers who will operate in schools. Though schooling is almost always an important part of someone's education (sometimes negatively) Cavell's characterization of philosophy as the education of grownups is mostly about what happens out of school.[3] Nonetheless reflections on his line of thought might have implications for how we think about the characterizations of education in some contemporary discussions.

I'll now describe the structure of this collection and comment on some of the essays. Evidently the essays were first presented at a Cavell Colloquium. This makes it possible to include some remarks (mostly from Cavell, but some from Hilary Putnam) from the discussion that ensued after each paper was given. The book also begins with an essay by Cavell reflecting on his own phrase "Philosophy as the Education of Grownups" and concludes with a brief coda, also by Cavell on "Philosophy as Education." I hope that the other distinguished contributors to this volume, on whose fine essays I shall comment below, will not be offended if I say that Cavell's contributions, both in his own essays here, and in his words with which they engage in theirs, are what make this collection essential reading. The other essays are divided into three groups. In Part I, "Entries on the Education of Grownups" there are essays by Hilary Putnam and Russell Goodman. Part II, "Skepticism and Language" has essays on the relationship of Cavell's treatment of this crucial theme to education by Paul Standish and Gordon C. F. Bearn. Part III, "Moral Perfectionism and Education" has essays by Vincent Colapietro, Rene V. Arcilla, and Naoko Saito. It also includes an interesting essay by Steven Odin comparing Cavell's treatment of "the ordinary" to the understanding of the ordinary in Zen and Nishida. This sorts oddly with the other essays but has its own definite interest.

This collection begins with a nice "Introduction" by the editors, reflecting on what in Cavell's thinking attracted them to him, and then introducing the individual essays. The introduction continues with Cavell's contribution, "Philosophy as the Education of Grownups," which turns out to be another discussion by Cavell of the opening paragraphs of Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations. Is there more for him to say on this, given his previously published commentaries? There is. He uses this occasion to reflect on Wittgenstein's view of language and how intimately that view is bound up with the natural feature of human life that we call education. We are reminded that language is a "natural" feature of human life, but that we must be initiated into its practices that are themselves intimately connected with almost all of the other human practices into which we must be initiated. Any view of language that would make this educative process impossible cannot be correct.

The first of the "Entries in the Education of Grownups" is Hilary Putnam's "The Fact-Value Dichotomy and Its Critics." This might seem somewhat out of place since it doesn't touch directly on the theme of education. (Putnam in fact had contributed another essay to one of the anthologies mentioned above, "Philosophy as the Education of Grownups: Stanley Cavell and Skepticism."[4] In that essay, he details a part of his own philosophical development as it was influenced by Cavell.) Instead Putnam discusses Part III of The Claim of Reason, calling attention to the fact that its initial version (written as part of Cavell's doctoral thesis) was one of the earliest, and broadest, critiques of what had been happening in mid-century analytical ethics, especially of the so-called "emotive theory" of ethics.[5] Putnam doesn't attempt to break new ground, but rather to tell a chapter of a story about moral philosophy in the twentieth century that is told more adequately when Cavell's role in it is recognized.

The second of the "Entries" is Russell Goodman's "Encountering Cavell: the Education of a Grownup." This essay, like Putnam's, doesn't engage the topic of education directly but rather exemplifies a case of the education of a grownup -- in this case Goodman himself -- under the tutelage of Stanley Cavell. Goodman's essay is charmingly autobiographical, recalling how his encounters with Cavell (his writing first, and then later coming to know him) helped to shape Goodman's own philosophical interests and career. His interest in Wittgenstein was transformed by an encounter with "The Availability of Wittgenstein's Later Philosophy," and he usefully recalls the sensational, and unexpected impact of that article on the philosophical world. He continues with an account of the ways in which Cavell's reflections on Romanticism and on American Philosophy helped him on his own course of writing and thinking. Here the idea of philosophy as the education of grownups shows itself with great clarity.

The two essays in "Part II: Skepticism and Language" are both interesting and provocative (in an Emersonian sense) in different ways on the implications of central themes of Cavell's thought. Paul Standish in "Skepticism, Acknowledgment and the Ownership of Learning" does succeed in showing the relevance of Cavell to contemporary discussions of the nature of education. The popular metaphor of "owning learning" and the idea of "learner-centered education" are responses to genuine issues in education, but Standish thinks that they can lead to certain forms of pathology in educational theory. He attempts to counter these pathologies in his reflections on Cavell's treatment of skepticism, and with an incisive account of the central idea of acknowledgment. Standish elucidates the idea of possessiveness or ownership, which seems to imply a commodification of learning, by a brief discussion of Heidegger and Thoreau. Standish believes that failure to accept "the ordinary conditions of learning" has led to the pathologies in educational theory with which he began. This essay does attempt to link Cavell's thought to contemporary issues in education as they are encountered in a school of education.

Gordon Bearn's essay, "Sensual Schooling: On the Aesthetic Education of Grownups," also attempts to connect to an actual problem in educational practice though he doesn't attempt to present a practical solution to that problem. It is also among the longest, and in some ways the most philosophically adventurous, of this book's essays. Bearn begins with a substantial discussion of a theme that surfaces several times in Whitehead's reflections on what he takes to be a failure in schooling (or, at least, a danger of a failure). This danger results from the academic overvaluation of the concepts that it employs in its theorization of the world. Bearn thinks that for Whitehead "What is privileged is the concrete reality that always exceeds whatever abstractions we use, however successfully to understand and control it." The remedy that Whitehead suggests is "art and aesthetic education" understood broadly, i.e., not as theoretical, conceptualized, art history, but as a way of attending mindfully to non-conceptual experience. This remedy would be what the title of Bearn's essay calls sensual schooling.

Bearn follows this discussion of Whitehead, with a long, thoughtful and insightful discussion of Cavell's reading of Wittgenstein on criteria, grammar and skepticism in The Claim of Reason. However, curiously to me, Bearn sees in Wittgenstein's account of the grammar of "expectation" a turning away from "the sensual detail of our experience." If this simply refers to the well-known theme in Philosophical Investigation that complex "mental" attitudes, emotions and sentiments cannot be identified with the sensations that may characteristically accompany them, it would be justified. Surely, however, that claim need not entail that one turns away from, or denies, the sensual detail of experience. Again, when Bearn writes of " Wittgenstein's opposition to taking sensual experience seriously" I don't find that characterization convincing. Wittgenstein took his experience of music, for example, very seriously -- so seriously that he couldn't write about it.[6] Bearn seems to see Cavell's Wittgenstein as one of those whom he quotes Whitehead as criticizing for having "an excessive trust in linguistic phrases." But Whitehead had to trust linguistic phrases like "linguistic phrases" too, and Bearn has to trust linguistic phrases like, "sensuous detail" and "concrete reality." The danger would be to restore the "myth of the given" under this new characterization. Of course, I don't think Bearn is proposing any such thing; the move to concreteness is relative, within language. However, he might find that Wittgenstein's thought could be used as a resource for the change in education that he seems to advocate.

The final group of essays is supposed to be united under the heading of perfectionism, but the members of that group have very different emphases. Vincent Colapietro's "Voice and the Interrogation of Philosophy: Inheritance, Abandonment and Jazz" is, for me, another highlight of this collection. His is the only essay that looks closely at the education of the grownup Stanley Cavell as reported in his autobiographical essays.[7] Surely he is on the right track here in understanding the idea of philosophy as the education of grownups, and surely the education of grownups can be understood against the idea of (Emersonian) perfectionism that Cavell has developed in a number of texts, but especially in Conditions Handsome and Unhandsome and later in Cities of Words. The themes of the child getting a voice (and a name), the experience of home and immigration, the outsider status of a young Jewish man playing jazz with older black men, the encounter with philosophy and music and literature and film are all powerfully present in Cavell's autobiographical exercises. Colapietro is well equipped to write about all of this in a beautifully constructed essay. The jauntiness of tone, and the range of reference, make it worthy of its subject, and his emphasis on the importance of one's own experience of the world (especially in this case, Cavell's task of remaining true to, and giving an account of, his experience) is a welcome reminder of the way in which the connection of philosophy to autobiography is through education.

Rene Arcilla in "Perfectionism's Educational Address" attempts a more general characterization of perfectionism, as Cavell understands it, in order to connect it to a conception of education central to the liberal arts tradition. This conception values education in itself as a crucial element in a life worth living, rather than for its utility for achieving other life goals. Arcilla looks at the set of perfectionist texts that Cavell has employed (rather than a definition of "perfectionism") in his consideration of it. What Arcilla finds to be most salient in these texts is their mode of address, that is, the way in which they seek to engage the reader. The perfectionist quest is one for self-intelligibility. It functions, according to Arcilla, not as a blueprint for a better self, but as a dialectical provocation to engage in the common project of going on -- and trying to go on better. In this sensitive essay, the author succeeds in connecting these philosophical reflections to the perennial reexamination of the meaning of liberal education.

Naoko Saito in "The Gleam of Light: Initiation, Prophecy, and Emersonian Moral Perfectionism," provides a clear account of some of Cavell's reading of Thoreau and Emerson as it relates to the theme of perfectionism. It would be a good starting point in this book for readers interested in but not yet much acquainted with Cavell's thought. Saito is particularly good at bringing out the way in which Cavell sees the connection between perfectionism and democracy -- how he does not have an elitist perfectionist view. The perfectionist quest is a human possibility (and may go better, or worse, for anyone.)

As mentioned previously, Steve Odin's "The Ordinary as Sublime in Cavell, Zen, and Nishida" is quite different from the other essays in this volume. It present parallels between those Eastern philosophies and some elements of Cavell's philosophy. Certainly the topic of the ordinary is crucial for Cavell both in his readings of Austin and Wittgenstein, and his finding those readings underwritten, to use his term, in Emerson's and Thoreau's recognition of the ordinary. This reviewer is not in a position to present an independent account of Zen and Nishida, but Odin is clear and persuasive on the resemblance of elements of these views from different philosophical traditions. In this brief essay, he doesn't have the opportunity to make much of the philosophical significance of this resemblance but he has certainly called attention to a fascinating topic for further exploration,

All in all, this is a quite good collection both for those who are already readers of Cavell and eager to see how others go on from his work, and for those in education who might be attracted to reading this philosopher whose mode of address, in all his writings, is a call to the perfectionist quest.

[1] I have in mind such works as: Russell Goodman (ed.) Contending with Stanley Cavell, (Oxford), Alice Crary and Sanford Shieh (eds.) Reading Cavell, (Routledge), Andrew Morris (ed.), The Claim to Community: Essays on Stanley Cavell and Political Philosophy, (Stanford), and the more recent James Loxley and Andrew Taylor, Stanley Cavell: Philosophy Literature, and Criticism, (Manchester), and Richard Eldridge and Bernard Rhie (eds.) Stanley Cavell and Literary Studies: Consequences of Skepticism, (Continuum). The newly published Rik Anthony Furtak, Jonathan Ellsworth, and James D. Reid, Thoreau's Importance for Philosophy, (Fordham), while technically not on Cavell, shows his influence throughout and contains an important contribution from Cavell as do most of the other works listed above. These books joined such earlier works as: Richard Fleming and Michael Payne, The Senses of Stanley Cavell, (Bucknell), Ted Cohen, Paul Guyer, and Hilary Putnam, Pursuits of Reason, (Texas Tech) and Richard Eldlridge, Stanley Cavell, (Cambridge). A bibliography of work on Cavell of course exceeds this list dramatically. There are now accessible on-line bibliographies of the Cavell literature.

[2] Stanley Cavell, The Claim of Reason, (Oxford), p.125

[3] As exemplified in the title of his collection of essays, Themes Out of School.

[4] Alice Crary and Sanford Shieh (eds.) Reading Cavell, (Routledge, London and New York, 2006), pp.119-130

[5] This is a story that I have attempted to tell in detail in "Stanley Cavell and Ethics" in Richard Eldridge (ed.), Stanley Cavell, (Cambridge Univ. Press, 2003) pp. 15-47

[6] See M. O'C. Drury's sketch in K.T. Fann (ed.), Wittgenstein: The Man and His Philosophy, (Dell Publishing, New York, 1967) pp. 67-68

[7] I refer to the essays in Stanley Cavell, A Pitch of Philosophy: Autobiographical Exercises, (Harvard University Press, 1994). Colapietro's essay was written well before Cavell"s autobiography, Little Did I Know, (Stanford University Press, 2011), was published.