Stanley Cavell, Religion, and Continental Philosophy

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Espen Dahl, Stanley Cavell, Religion, and Continental Philosophy, Indiana University Press, 2014, 177pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253012029.

Reviewed by Peter Dula, Eastern Mennonite University


For a long time, Stanley Cavell was the least read of his generation of American philosophical greats. Richard Rorty, Donald Davidson, John Rawls, Hilary Putnam, Arthur Danto and Thomas Kuhn all became famous (as famous as philosophers can be) while Cavell remained relatively obscure for most of his career. That has changed decisively since the early 2000s. In the last five years alone, almost 10 monographs have appeared on his work. Most of these are by literature professors, almost none, sadly, are by philosophers, and a few are by theologians and scholars of religion. The newest addition to the latter is Espen Dahl's impressive book, one that lives up to every aspect of its title. Dahl has a comprehensive grasp on Cavell's thought, is clearly a gifted theologian, and manages to place Cavell in conversation with continental thought as productively as anyone before him. Moreover, he does so in prose that is a model of clarity and brevity. Just see his overview of Cavell's "ordinary" (7-13), which manages to be a frankly stunning six page summary of Cavell's work as a whole.

The theologian drawn to Cavell has to first get past those early readings that understood Cavell as a secular and atheist philosopher, whether, like Richard Eldridge, they approve of his atheism or, like Judith Tonning and the early Stephen Mulhall, they disapprove. That reading flattens the complexity and ambivalence of Cavell's many remarks on religion. Dahl follows an alternative line of thought, which argues for Cavell's openness to religious and theological concerns.

So Dahl's task is threefold. He needs to, first, provide readings of Cavell's frequent, and often apparently contradictory, statements about religion. Second, he needs to make clear just why "the structure of thought entailed in such key notions as skepticism, sin, acknowledgement, and redemption overlap so significantly with theological concerns" (3). And, third, he must do so without overplaying his hand, that is, without obscuring Cavell's ambivalence in favor of affirmation. As he puts it, "I want neither to extricate Cavell's theology from theology nor establish a forced unity, but rather to think of his philosophy and theology as a fruitful companionship" (6). Though I have questions about aspects of Dahl's presentation, by any measure he succeeds admirably.

The first two chapters perform much of the work of surveying Cavell's various remarks about religion and especially Christianity. They map the space Cavell inhabits in relation to religion and demonstrate his "openness toward the problem of religion" (47). Against the secular and atheist readings of Cavell, these chapters show how Cavell's most negative comments about Christianity and religion turn out to be complex and ambivalent on close reading. Dahl ably critiques Mulhall's early criticisms of Cavell on this score (but unfortunately neglects Mulhall's later work, which has much in common with Dahl's own reading).

In chapters three and four, Dahl undertakes most explicitly the task of showing the affinity between Cavell's central themes -- skepticism, finitude, acknowledgement -- and theological concerns. Somehow Jesus Christ is a genuine possible answer to philosophical problems. How so? What is it about Cavell's philosophical diagnosis that invites consideration of theology? In chapter three, "Acknowledging God," Dahl shows how much Cavell's notion of "acknowledgment" overlaps with Christian accounts of confession. He argues, rightly, that "the kind of knowledge acquired through confessions is at the heart of ordinary language philosophy" (55). The ordinary language philosopher's recurring question, "what do we say when?" is a demand for confession, hence Wittgenstein's admiration for Augustine. Dahl handles this material well, but the most significant contribution of this chapter is when he moves from Augustine to Luther in order to move from acknowledgment of an other to acknowledgment of God. While not denying that there are crucial distinctions to be made between the two kinds of acknowledgement, Dahl argues that Luther wants us to stop thinking of God as "something out there -- a metaphysical fact or Ding an sich (the thing in itself) -- which we should know but cannot reach" (60), and which is exposed as the skeptic's picture of God. "Luther wants to attract us to another, more useful picture, one in which we are called not to gain knowledge but to acknowledge God by trusting his promise" (61). Putting knowledge and acknowledgment in that kind of dualism is a slightly misleading way to put it, but it is still an important point. It may help us think about the vexed relationship between faith and works in Luther just insofar as faith and acknowledgment both require responsiveness.

In chapter four, Dahl elaborates on the ways in which Cavell's account of skepticism can helpfully illuminate Christian understandings of original sin and vice versa. If skepticism is, in Cavell's words, "the central secular place in which the human wish to deny the condition of human existence is expressed," then, Dahl adds, sin is the religious place (67). Key pieces of Cavell's interpretation of skepticism make such a move possible. For Cavell, skepticism is not an intellectual mistake, nor is it a failure of knowledge. Rather it is a condition in which we are disappointed in the success of knowledge, disappointed in our finitude and hence deny our finitude, our humanity. Cavell occasionally makes the theological connection explicit, writing, "This denial of finitude has also been taken as the mark of sin" (quoted, 76). When he adds, "Nothing is more human than the wish to deny one's humanity" (80), he nicely captures the predicament of sin. Dahl's contribution is to expound on this through a reading of Cavell on Kant ("philosophy's interpretation of the Fall" (70), and his reading of Adam and Eve. To put it far too schematically, in one, skepticism is interpreted as sin. In the other, sin is interpreted as skepticism.

Chapters five and six continue elaborating the "anthropology of finitude" (121), expanding chapter four's account of sin to include tragedy and violence. Tragedy and violence, key themes in Cavell, also provide springboards for Dahl's reading of Cavell's relationship to continental philosophy, specifically Derrida and Levinas. Significantly, Dahl's chapter on tragedy is less interested in Cavell's readings of Shakespeare than in his account of Derrida's quarrel with Austin. This is not a criticism. By treating the Derrida/Austin debate, Dahl is able to both trace the roots of tragedy to the ordinary and provide the best account of the differences between Cavell and Derrida that I know of.

The Cavell/Derrida relationship is treated further in chapter seven, this time in the context of Derrida's work on gift and Cavell's on forgiveness. If chapters four through six were on the "anthropology of finitude," chapter seven returns to the theme of chapter three, acknowledgment, this time taking acknowledgment as forgiveness as the necessary companion of acknowledgement as confession. Here Dahl finds that Cavell comes out closer to theological readings of gift, such as that of John Milbank, than he does to Derrida. But this is also the chapter that sets up Dahl's Conclusion. The entire book before the closing pages of chapter seven explores the complicated ambivalence of Cavell's relationship to religion and theology, patiently and carefully reading Cavell's many remarks about religion in order to map that space. Chapter seven concludes with, "It seems that we are finally reaching the juncture where the paths part" (138).

That juncture is reached when, after a discussion of the importance of forgiveness in Cavell's readings of the Hollywood comedies of remarriage and of Shakespeare's The Winter's Tale, Dahl turn to the question of the difficulty of receiving, accepting forgiveness. In The Winter's Tale "Leontes's acceptance of forgiveness . . . requires an achievement of something I am prepared to call a passiveness beyond passiveness" (quoted, 134). Dahl takes this to mean that forgiveness is difficult to accept precisely because it is something received (passively). One of Cavell's achievements has been to acknowledge and elevate the importance of the passive, making clear the "intimate and complex relation between passivity and activity" (135). Following the lead of Timothy Gould, Dahl is able to tie this to a Lutheran account of faith. "Luther is cherished for emphasizing . . . the affirmation of passivity, as countering false activity as concealing our relation to God and to ourselves" (136). Forgiveness, like grace, requires this kind of passivity in order to be accepted. But what makes such passivity possible? What gives us the courage to cease our relentless, self-justifying activity? Here Dahl's Lutheran Cavell must give way to Luther himself. It is through faith that we are justified by grace alone, which enables such passivity. "But will Cavell grant such faith" (138)?

Dahl knows that his book has run the risk of making Cavell too Christian, of muting Cavell's difference in the attempt to make plain Cavell's affinity with Christianity. "Since my interest lies in countering the impression of Cavell as hostile to religion as such, my efforts run the danger of overemphasizing the other side of the story" (139). So as if to make up for running that risk, Dahl's concluding chapter, poses a stark dualism: "Self-redemption or divine redemption." Now Emerson, a bit player until these final pages, becomes more central, and Cavell turns into the kind of individualist that Emerson is so often accused of being. According to Dahl, for Cavell and Emerson, you follow "no one but yourself, your genius; in the New Testament, you follow a divine call" (145). Dahl shows some hesitancy about this way of putting it but doesn't provide the close and imaginative readings he supplied with so many other complex passages and themes in Cavell. Earlier, in his chapter on Levinas, Dahl quoted the two times Cavell says that we can be Christ for each other (116). Such remarks might have provided Dahl with an opportunity not to make Cavell more Christian, but to do what he has been doing all along. The complex ambivalence that characterizes the companionship of Cavell and philosophy goes all the way. It doesn't end at one neat point. Suggesting that Cavell and theology "finally" part ways seems misleading for two reasons. First, they have been parting in various ways throughout the book, and second, this final parting is more complicated than Dahl lets on. Among the losses for readers is that they can't learn much from this book about just why Emerson is so important to Cavell, why he is arguably second only to Wittgenstein among Cavell's influences, and therefore how Cavell challenges conventional readings of Emerson.

I have one other related concern about the book. That is the absence of Cavell's political philosophy. Dahl extricates Emersonian perfectionism from its place in an argument with Rawls and Kripke. (In Cavell's hands, Kripke's work on Wittgenstein becomes politicized.) Cavell's abiding interest in social contract theory, from the opening chapter of The Claim of Reason through Cities of Words is nowhere to be found in Dahl. Is this simply the result of writing a short book? Dahl can't be expected to cover everything that a philosopher as wide-ranging as Cavell takes up. Or is it more problematic?  I worry that detaching perfectionism from its radically democratic politics is part of the reason Dahl can turn Cavell into a cliché Emersonian individualist in his conclusion. This is not just about Cavell interpretation; it is about theology. Dahl's Cavell without politics matches his own theology without church (at least as it is presented in this book). I worry also that without the mutual antagonism of Cavell's vision of democratic companionship, the companionship Dahl proposes can only push him to make theological criticisms of Cavell, but never to make Cavellian criticisms of theology.

Such criticisms are not meant to deny the great value of this book. It deserves attention because of how ably it fulfills its overarching aim of "elaborat[ing] the analogies and overlappings between Cavell's philosophy and his religious perspective" (139). But perhaps more importantly to those theologians and philosophers who don't need to be convinced of that argument, the great reward of Cavell, Religion, and Continental Philosophy is in the details. I mean, for example, with the exception of Sarah Beckwith, no one has yet paid as much attention to Cavell's Luther as Dahl does. Nor has anyone written as well on Derrida and Cavell, or been so lucid about Cavell's early Beckett essay. For these reasons, and many more, this book deserves wide readership.