Stanley Cavell

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Eldridge, Richard (ed.), Stanley Cavell, Cambridge, 2003, 260pp, $20.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521779723.

Reviewed by Steven G. Affeldt , University of Notre Dame


Including the substantial Introduction by Richard Eldridge, this volume consists of nine previously unpublished essays each of which focuses upon a single region of Cavell’s work. While the scope of the issues considered in the volume can be only incompletely indicated by listing the regions addressed, they include: ethics, philosophy of action, the normativity of language, aesthetics and modernism, American philosophy, Shakespeare, film, television, and opera, and the relation of Cavell’s work to German philosophy and Romanticism. The volume also contains a useful index, and a brief annotated bibliography of works by and about Cavell.

Both the format of the volume, segmenting Cavell’s work into more or less discrete regions and assigning a single essay to each, and the nature of many of the individual essays, are to a significant extent determined by the fact that the volume appears in the Cambridge University Press series “Contemporary Philosophy in Focus.” The description of the series specifies that the volumes are intended as “introductory,” that they “consist of newly commissioned essays that cover major contributions of a preeminent philosopher in a systematic and accessible manner,” that the essays “do not presuppose that readers are already familiar with the details of [the] philosopher’s work,” and that they “will thus combine exposition and critical analysis in a manner that will appeal both to students of philosophy and to professionals and to students across the humanities and social sciences.”

This can sound like a sensible mandate for (marketing) a series of volumes, but it is not obviously practicable. Beyond the evident and quite general difficulty of producing essays that will be at once accessible to readers with no prior familiarity with the details of a philosophers work and useful for those more deeply involved with it, there are special obstacles to realizing this mandate when the work of the philosopher in question is Stanley Cavell. Three immediate such obstacles are the following. First, as many of the contributors to this volume note, although Cavell’s work unfolds across an unusually wide range of areas, it is also deeply unified by systematic continuities of concern; and this unity is, to an important extent, incompatible with segmenting it into discrete “major contributions” treated in isolation from the rest. Second, Cavell’s work relies upon, and demands, such scrupulous attention to the specificity of words and the contexts of their employment that any attempt to address it at a level that prescinds from the fine-grained structure of its details is likely to be either quite misleading or very nearly empty. And third, there is arguably no contemporary philosopher who has more acutely challenged the idea of an (orderly or predictable) “introduction” to the work of philosophy. That is, there is no telling in advance what will open an issue or the work of a philosopher for one philosophically, as opposed to, for example, as a matter of intellectual history.

That the individual essays in this volume so successfully negotiate the hazards internal to the mandate they were asked to meet is a significant measure of their quality.

I will briefly touch upon many of the essays shortly. Before doing so, however, it will be helpful to sketch two different conceptions of the “introductory” in terms of which they may be characterized and grouped. One the one hand, the introductory may be understood to involve situating the work of a thinker within its historical and disciplinary context or the context of his/her further work and in this way illuminating its motivations and aims, summarizing its principle claims and arguments, articulating questions raised by the work, and the like. Such a conception of the introductory will presume little prior familiarity with the work in question, will operate at a level more or less distant from its details, and will tend in the direction of removing the need (for a certain type of reader with certain kinds of interests) to read the work in question. One is given the general idea. On the other hand, the introductory may be understood as directed less toward conveying the central ideas to those with little prior familiarity with the work than toward providing readers at any level with resources or avenues for more fruitfully taking up and going on from the work. This second conception of the introductory may or may not also perform some of the same functions as the first, but will necessarily engage more closely with specific details, and will be less concerned with summary than with developing a helpful angle on (some aspect of) the work and returning readers to it with new questions and transformed perspective. In this second sense, much of Cavell’s own best work may be described as seeking to be introductory.

No essay in this volume embodies either of these conceptions of the introductory unalloyed, but each tends, and some heavily, toward one or the other. Among the essays hewing most closely to the first conception of the introductory, those that do so most productively are Stanley Bates’ “Stanley Cavell and Ethics,” Anthony J. Cascardi’s “’Disowning Knowledge’: Cavell on Shakespeare,” and William Rothman’s “Cavell on Film, Television, and Opera.” Each not only provides a lucid general account of the issues and main claims within its respective region of Cavell’s work but also includes moments that provoke deeper critical attention. For example, Bates importantly urges the necessity of situating the chapters of Part Three of The Claim of Reason against the background of early analytic moral philosophy, and provides a quite helpful sketch of that background, while also arguing against the impression that, therefore, these chapters have no continuing relevance and suggesting several ways in which they do. Cascardi offers a brief but quite suggestive set of remarks about the sense in which, for Cavell, human consciousness and experience are inherently dramatic in form. And, among a number of quite suggestive claims that emerge within Rothman’s essay, I will note only his discussion of how and why film, as a medium, is committed to moral perfectionism and his suggestion that to the extent that the difficulty of assessing the thought of film is the same as the difficulty of assessing our everyday experience, Cavell’s work on film provides a way into and through that difficulty.

Among the essays hewing more closely to the second conception of the introductory, I find most stimulating Richard Eldridge’s “Introduction: Between Acknowledgment and Avoidance,” Timothy Gould’s “The Names of Action,” Stephen Mulhall’s “Stanley Cavell’s Vision of the Normativity of Language,” and Jay Bernstein’s “Aesthetics, Modernism, Literature: Cavell’s Transformation of Philosophy.” Each is difficult and no reader of Cavell will agree with all that any contains. But their difficulty is, for the most part, necessary and, if readers may disagree, they will also have to acknowledge that the disagreements are over deep points and not quickly to be settled.

Again, I will only briefly note a few specific points. Eldridge draws upon his long-standing concerns with achieving expressive freedom to sketch a provocative proposal concerning the dynamics of avoidance and acknowledgment in Cavell’s work; and while one may doubt that his wish to find a balance and harmony between these would seem as reasonable had their specific relation to skepticism in Cavell’s writing been given more attention, the essay opens a genuinely helpful perspective on much that is most central in Cavell. Gould’s essay powerfully argues that Cavell’s peculiar approach to issues of action--the issues are both pervasive and often all but invisible--is bound up at once with the difficulty internal to characterizing “ordinary actions” and with his efforts to transform how the philosophy of action is conceived. Mulhall carefully examines Cavell’s apparent hostility to appeal to rules in accounting for the normativity of uses of language, and argues, controversially to be sure, that Cavell’s specific arguments against appeals to rules do not generalize and that his positive views are, in fact, not only compatible with the more nuanced view of rules he finds in the work of Baker and Hacker but dependent upon such a view. Bernstein’s especially rich and searching essay is, in the end, nothing less than an attempt to argue that Cavell’s work is essentially modernist in both its methods and its aims, and that, for this reason much of what is most central and challenging in that work may be understood through what Bernstein calls the logic of exemplarity.

As useful as the individual essays comprising this volume are, it is even more helpful as a volume. It is not simply that the individual essays offer sometimes widely differing views of Cavell’s work and exemplify different ways of engaging and employing it. It is also, and more importantly, that read together the essays both complement or supplement one another and, frequently, may be brought into argument with one another. For example: One cost of Bates’ careful attention to Cavell’s engagement with ethics in Part Three of The Claim of Reason is that he is able to give only very brief attention to his more recent writing on moral perfectionism and perfectionist exemplarity. But this cost is significantly defrayed by the fact that Rothman gives a good deal of direct attention to these issues and that Bernstein so thoroughly develops the issue of exemplarity more generally. William Desmond’s essay on Cavell’s relation to German philosophy and Romanticism (which is unique among the essays in this volume in giving very little direct attention to any of Cavell’s texts), argues that a notion of transcendence is deeply implicated in Cavell’s work and that this notion, as Desmond understands it, requires a religious backing that Cavell fails to provide. This essay may, then, be brought into argument with Bernstein’s, which not only provides resources for resisting Desmond’s conception of transcendence but argues that Cavell’s modernism can only make sense in a setting after the death of God. One central argument of Mulhall’s turns on Cavell’s early Austinian perception that speaking is a kind of doing, that when we talk about talking we are talking about a species of action. But his use of this thought is powerfully challenged by Gould’s argument, drawing on material in Cavell’s . Pitch of Philosophy, that speaking is, in important ways, not simply a species of action. A number of further examples could be provided. These should suffice, however, to suggest that, for all of their individual value, it is through the ways in which these essays may be read with and against one another that this volume will be most helpful in encouraging the kind of attention to Cavell’s work that it both merits and demands.

One final point must be noted. It is a deeply peculiar, indeed quite puzzling, feature of this volume that it includes no essay dealing specifically with Cavell’s work on traditional epistemology and skepticism. Anyone familiar with Cavell’s work will know that issues of skepticism are at the heart of nearly everything he has written, as is attested by the fact that most of the essays in this volume at least touch on one or another aspect of his engagement with skepticism. Rather than remedying this omission, however, this fact only makes more pressing the need for an essay treating this material systematically.