States of Affairs

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Maria Elisabeth Reicher (ed.), States of Affairs, Ontos, 2009, 219pp., €79.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380408.

Reviewed by E. J. Lowe, Durham University



This is an extremely well-informed and interesting collection of newly written papers on the ontology of states of affairs, by some well-known metaphysicians all of whom have thought long and hard about the subject. The editor, Maria Elisabeth Reicher, evidently posed a well-chosen set of questions to the contributors with the aim of getting them to focus on certain common themes — and this strategy has paid off, by revealing important differences of opinion amongst the authors about many crucial issues. She also contributes a very thorough and informative introduction to the volume which provides a helpful framework, both historical and contemporary, to the various positions and arguments presented by the other contributors. Some of the key questions addressed by them are these: (1) Why should we suppose that there are states of affairs — that such entities really exist? (2) Assuming them to exist, are states of affairs concrete or abstract entities and, relatedly, are they causally efficacious and contingent beings or causally inert and necessary beings? (3) Can we perceive states of affairs? (4) What is the ‘inner structure’ of states of affairs? (5) What is the relation between states of affairs and events? (6) What is the relation between states of affairs and propositions? (7) Are there ‘molecular’, or only ‘atomic’, states of affairs? (8) Are there ‘higher-order’ states of affairs? (9) Do modal truths require special states of affairs as their truthmakers? (10) Are there ‘future-tensed’ and ‘past-tensed’ states of affairs? (11) Are there ‘existence’ states of affairs, such as the state of affairs that Paris exists? (12) If so, is there a property of existence that is a ‘constituent’ of such states of affairs? These are the questions explicitly addressed by the first paper in the collection, David Armstrong’s admirably succinct ‘Questions about States of Affairs’, but many of them are addressed also by most of the other contributors. They and their papers, in order of appearance, are the following: Uwe Meixner, ‘States of Affairs — the Full Picture’; Erwin Tegtmeier, ‘Facts and Connectors’; Herbert Hochberg, ‘Facts and Things’; Peter Simons, ‘Why There Are No States of Affairs’; Mark Textor, ‘Are Particulars or States of Affairs Given in Perception?’; L. Nathan Oaklander, ‘Time and Existence: A Critique of “Degree Presentism”’; and Marian David, ‘Defending Existentialism’.

Armstrong, at the outset of his paper, remarks that

It seems to me that once one accepts the objective reality of properties and relations … then it is inevitable that one accepts states of affairs of some sort’ and goes on to contend that ‘If you accept that these properties [and relations] … are universals as I do, … then [you will accept that] the instantiations of universals … are states of affairs (p. 39).

However, it seems to me that one can readily accept that there are property-universals, such as redness, without accepting that their instantiations (their particular instances) are states of affairs: one can — and, I would urge, should — take the instances of property-universals to be tropes (or, as I would prefer to call them, modes), such as the particular redness of a certain red apple. Such an entity is a simple particular, not a complex, in contrast with the putative state of affairs of the apple’s being red. Armstrong assumes, as many other metaphysicians do, that the choice between regarding properties as universals and regarding them as tropes or modes is an exclusive one, but in fact it is very natural to accept both property-universals and tropes or modes, and to regard the latter as being particular instances of the former.

Armstrong, however, contends that even if one does regard properties as tropes one ‘must also accept the existence of states of affairs’, whether one regards the individual objects whose tropes they are as bundles of tropes (as D. C. Williams did) or as irreducible particulars, remarking that adherents of the latter ‘substance-attribute’ theory (such as C. B. Martin and John Heil) ‘have to link their tropes to particulars as attributes of those particulars’ (p. 40). But that really isn’t so, since such theorists are adamant that tropes are ontologically dependent and ‘non-transferable’ particulars, requiring no such ‘link’ to their respective substances: this red apple’s redness trope, according to such a theory, depends for its very existence and identity upon this apple, so that if the trope exists, then the apple must exist too and ‘have’ the trope. Of course, Armstrong does not like the idea of necessary connections between (wholly) distinct existences any more than Hume did, and so must dislike this theory: for, according to it, the apple’s redness trope is necessarily connected to the apple, despite not being a part of it (as on the ‘bundle’ theory). Nevertheless many philosophers, in whose number I include myself, will think that the acceptance of such necessary connections is an attractive price to pay to avoid the many difficulties seemingly posed by trying to make sense of states of affairs. In this regard, my sympathies lie with the views expressed by Peter Simons in his contribution to the present collection. With Simons, and against Armstrong, I would urge that the truthmaker of the proposition that this apple is red is just this apple’s redness trope, not the putative state of affairs of this apple’s being red. Once deprived of their putative truthmaking role, however, states of affairs begin to look metaphysically redundant for other purposes too, for which either tropes or propositions offer themselves as attractive and more readily intelligible alternatives. I shall comment on some of these other purposes later in this review, in the course of discussing the remaining contributions.

Before doing so, however, I want to focus briefly on some positive reasons for rejecting states of affairs. Reicher, in her introduction, explicitly mentions only three objections to them: the oddity objection, the regress objection, and the no universals objection. The first is the relatively weak objection that states of affairs seem strange in being able, apparently, to possess both concrete and abstract constituents, such as this apple (a concrete individual) and the property-universal redness (the assumption being that the latter is an abstract entity). One immediate reply is that many realists about universals, including Armstrong, would not accept that they are abstract entities, saying instead that they differ from concrete individuals only in being ‘multiply locatable’. More to the point, however, it is not clear what objection of principle one could raise against the existence of entities which somehow ‘contain’ both concrete and abstract elements: after all, most philosophers happily accept that sets can, such as the set whose members are Paris and the number 3. The ‘no universals’ objection is equally weak, this being the objection that if, because one is a nominalist, one rejects universals, then one must reject states of affairs too, since these are supposed to be constituents of at least some states of affairs. The obvious and proper reply is: so what? For it is not as though nominalism — these days, at least — is widely regarded as unproblematic.

As for the regress objection, this is more serious, the regress in question being Bradley’s famous one. Here the problem is to explain what unifies the constituents of a state of affairs within that state of affairs, such as this apple and redness in the state of affairs of this apple’s being red. If one posits an ‘exemplification’ relation between the apple and redness as performing this unifying role, it will be objected that this is just to identify a third putative constituent within the state of affairs, leaving us with essentially the same problem as before: to explain what unifies all three within that state of affairs. The solutions that have been proposed to this apparent problem are many, including the ‘Fregean’ idea that universals are ‘unsaturated’ entities, needing no metaphysical ‘glue’ to adhere them to their individual bearers and Gustav Bergmann’s idea (interestingly discussed in this volume by Erwin Tegtmeier) that exemplification is a connector (now sometimes called a ‘non-relational tie’) rather than a relation (that is, rather than a relational universal). There is, however, a slightly ad hoc air about such putative solutions, as well as an apparent reliance upon inadequately discharged metaphors.

Not being an advocate of states of affairs myself, I offer no solution of my own to this problem. However, I would simply remark, once more, that tropes or modes can easily perform the task that states of affairs theorists want somehow to get done here — the task of linking a concrete individual to a property-universal in such a way that a proposition predicating that property of that individual is thereby made true. Thus, to repeat, if this apple’s redness — a trope or mode of this apple — exists, then that suffices to ‘make true’ the proposition that this apple is red, because the trope essentially belongs to this apple and is also essentially an instance of redness. (To put it another way: in every possible world in which this apple’s redness exists, it is true that this apple exists and is red, so that the existence of this apple’s redness necessitates the truth of the proposition that this apple is red.) Obviously, however, this fact is of no comfort to the friends of states of affairs, since it doesn’t provide a solution to their regress problem, but only serves to show that states of affairs are redundant as truthmakers of predicative propositions. It would be hopeless for a states of affairs theorist to propose that the state of affairs of this apple’s being red contains, as a ‘third constituent’ linking the other two, this apple’s redness trope or mode. For this putative ‘third constituent’ does, all by itself, the truthmaking job that the whole state of affairs was supposed to perform, rendering the whole and its other two constituents redundant for that purpose.

One objection to states of affairs that Reicher doesn’t explicitly mention and that only a few of the contributors to this volume touch upon concerns their individuation. An aspect of this problem is illustrated by the case of two states of affairs containing a non-symmetrical relation holding in different ‘directions’ between the same relata, such as the states of affairs of Mary loving John and John loving Mary. These states of affairs must certainly be regarded as different and yet they supposedly contain exactly the same constituents: Mary, John, and the relation of loving. But then what makes them different, given that their constituents do not? One may be inclined to reply: the order in which Mary and John enter into the loving relation. Such a reply might be adequate if the problem were, instead, to explain what constitutes the difference between the written sentences ‘Mary loves John’ and ‘John loves Mary’, because here we literally have a difference in the spatial ordering of the same words, but nothing analogous seems to be so readily on hand in the case of states of affairs. Trope theorists seem to face no similar problem because, as Simons points out in this volume, Mary’s loving trope belongs to her and has John as its intentional object whereas John’s loving trope belongs to him and has her as its intentional object (p. 122). We have two indisputably different entities as truthmakers for the propositions that Mary loves John and that John loves Mary, whereas the states of affairs theorist has yet clearly to explain precisely in what the difference consists between the two states of affairs that are the putative truthmakers of those two propositions. Perhaps the ultimate lesson of this example is that ‘states of affairs’ are the product of a lazy approach to ontology: one which attempts to ‘read off’ the elements of being from the structure of language — in this case from the structure of sentences, of which ‘states of affairs’ seem to be the mere shadows. (Another and more general problem concerning the individuation of states of affairs is posed by the so-called ‘slingshot argument’ that can be directed against them, one version of which led Donald Davidson to claim that all ‘facts’ collapse into the one Great Fact. This isn’t discussed in the present volume — although it is mentioned in passing by Tegtmeier (p. 80), only to be dismissed — which may be a disappointment to some readers.)

I turn now, finally, to the contributions in the volume not so far discussed. Uwe Meixner posits states of affairs not as truthmakers but rather as the objects of various ‘intentional’ (others would say ‘propositional’) attitudes, such as beliefs. I remain unconvinced, being happy to say that such attitudes have propositional contents but no special objects in the shape of states of affairs (although, if de re, they may indeed have particular objects, as when I believe of this apple that it is red) — another point on which I am in agreement with Simons. Herbert Hochberg writes on some interesting parallels between Peter Abelard and twentieth-century nominalists on the subject of relations. Mark Textor argues in defence of our taking particulars, rather than states of affairs or ‘facts’, to be what we perceive, the particulars in question not just including individual concrete objects, such as this apple, but also the particular ‘features’ — that is, the tropes or modes - of these objects, such as this apple’s redness and roundness. I agree entirely, and indeed have argued in favour of this view myself elsewhere. On this view, ‘S perceives that p’ is properly taken to ascribe a perceptually based judgement to S, rather than to specify an object of S‘s perceptual experience. Nathan Oaklander argues against Quentin Smith’s recent theory of ‘degree presentism’, according to which (as far as I can understand it) there are tensed facts but past and future-tensed facts have a lesser degree of existence than present-tensed facts, which are taken to be maximally real, and temporal passage involves a progressive gain and then decrease of such degrees of existence. Although my own sympathies lie with a kind of presentism rather than with the eternalism that Oaklander favours, I agree with Oaklander that Smith’s new theory is fraught with difficulties. As for the frequently advanced objection that presentists have trouble finding truthmakers for past- and future-tensed sentences, I am inclined to urge that all tensed propositions are present-tensed and that a true past- or future-tensed sentence is true only because the corresponding proposition had or will have a truthmaker. So, for example, the sentence ‘Caesar crossed the Rubicon’ is true now only because the proposition that Caesar is crossing the Rubicon long ago had a truthmaker — not because that sentence now has a truthmaker, which is something that no sensible presentist should feel forced to say. There is, I believe, no vicious circularity in this proposal, since it is not offering a reductive account of the meaning of the past and future tenses.

In the volume’s final paper, Marian David discusses a well-known argument of Alvin Plantinga’s against so-called ‘Russellian’ singular propositions, which are supposed to be able to include contingent concrete beings amongst their ‘constituents’ (and in that respect, at least, seem more closely akin to states of affairs than ‘Fregean’ propositions do). If Paris does not exist is such a proposition, albeit a contingently false one, then the problem is that it supposedly depends for its existence on Paris and yet, being only contingently false, could have been true — although, obviously, only in circumstances in which Paris did not exist. However, in such circumstances the proposition itself would allegedly not have existed, so how could it have been true in them? The obvious response is to say that a proposition can be true of circumstances in which it does not itself exist as a true proposition, just as a sentence can truly describe circumstances in which no sentences exist. David, however, suggests that this obvious response does not go to the heart of the matter. His paper makes a fine conclusion to an excellent collection.