Staying Alive: Personal Identity, Practical Concerns, and the Unity of a Life

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Marya Schechtman, Staying Alive: Personal Identity, Practical Concerns, and the Unity of a Life, Oxford University Press, 2014, 214pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199684878.

Reviewed by Raymond Martin, Union College


How at this late date in the discussion within contemporary analytic philosophy of personhood and personal identity can one make a significant new contribution to our understanding of both? One way, surely, is by shifting the focus away from those aspects of the debate that have been overworked in the literature and putting it onto issues that have not gotten the attention they deserve. But how to do that? In this valuable addition to the literature on personhood and personal identity Marya Schechtman may have found a way. It is by moving the analytic debate in a more empirical direction. This is by no means all she does in this important new book (I'll return to some of the rest of it in a moment), and she may not agree with my way of putting even this part of what she has done, but I would like to start anyway with what I take to be this part of her contribution.

According to Schechtman's new view, which she calls the person life view and which is in the tradition of the practically oriented accounts of Christine Korsgaard and Lynne Baker, "facts about the literal identity of beings like us are inherently connected to practical considerations" (p. 10). She acknowledges that "There is an enormous number of practical questions and concerns that are associated with personal identity" (p. 66). Her goal is to identify a basic practical unity that can serve as "a target of all of these myriad concerns and practices" (p. 67). That basic practical unity, which she calls a person life, is at the center of her account. Among other things, she says that to be a person is to live a "person life," that persons are individuated by individuating person lives, and that the duration of a person is determined by the duration of a person life (p. 110).

So, what is a person life? Schechtman begins her answer by taking typical enculturated humans ("beings like us") as paradigm cases of persons and then characterizes what their lives are like. Typically, she says, such humans begin with a period of social dependence and relatively basic cognitive capacities, which develop over time into a much fuller range of personal capacities and activities. At various places and to various degrees during this development they are sentient, self-conscious, self-narrators, and rational/moral agents. This happens within the context of an involvement with family, friends and tribal or community ties. Optimally it also happens in "an environment that provides the proper scaffolding and social support" for their development (p. 112).

In other words, in Schechtman's view a person life has as its main components, first, "the attributes of the individual -- the physical and psychological capacities and internal structures that she possesses," second, "the kinds of activities and interactions that make up the individual's daily life," and, third, "the social and cultural infrastructure of personhood -- the set of practices and institutions that provides the backdrop within which the kinds of activities that make up the form of life of personhood become possible" (pp. 112-13). The second and third of these items open the door to the exploration of empirical issues that have not received much attention in the analytic literature.

Schechtman says that "to truly understand" the lives of actual persons "we need to look not only at individual social interactions and practical activities but at the stable background structures that make these possible" (p. 113). One striking thing about this claim is that she has as her goal a holistic understanding of what it actually is to be a person. Most theorists do not have this as their goal, but something more limited, such as the metaphysics of personhood or of personal identity. The second thing is that the background structures on which she is focusing include "norms and practices within which individuals operate and which set the parameters of their interactions" (p. 113). These, too, have been neglected in the analytic philosophical literature.

To illustrate what sorts of norms and practices she has in mind Schechtman notes that in present-day industrialized countries the births of humans are recorded, and human infants are dressed in clothes and exposed to various kinds of education. Ultimately they become "subject to the laws of the land and can potentially be arrested and brought to trial if there is reason to think they have willfully violated them" (p. 114). They also become eligible to qualify for social welfare programs, and so on. She notes that while "The particular practices and institutions will of course vary from place to place and time to time," it is nevertheless "necessary for there to be some [such practices and institutions] if there are to be person lives at all" (p. 114). Such infrastructure, she says, defines a "person space" by setting the broad parameters within which interpersonal interactions take place. "Being brought into the form of life of personhood may be described as being accorded a place in person-space" (p. 114).

Schechtman says that it would be artificial to distinguish sharply among the three main components of a person life that she mentions since "in actual lives they constrain and support each other." Perhaps the most important way they do this is that the infrastructure not only "shapes the kinds of daily activities, relationships, and interactions a person engages in by setting the parameters within which these take place and providing the background institutions and practices they require," but it "is also constrained by the physical and psychological attributes of the individuals who reside in the person-space it defines" (p. 115). For example, "the development of institutions and norms of the sort that define person lives (e.g., prisons or systems of punishment, economies, theologies, art)" both requires and is shaped by "beings who have certain kinds of memory systems, reflective self-consciousness, rationality, and related cognitive and affective abilities" (p. 116).

In paradigmatic instances of persons, Schechtman says, biological, psychological, and social characteristics are deeply intertwined and functioning together. In her view, what constitutes a person and determines his or her continuation is not some specific selection from among the tangle of these characteristics but rather "the tangle itself" (p. 201). Following other theorists, she calls such entanglements homeostatic property clusters. In her view, what these are in the case of human persons is an interrelated collection of characteristics, none of which has overriding importance but all of which, influencing and influenced by the others, contribute collectively to personhood and persistence, acquiring over time a developmental structure that constitutes a person life. According to the traditional understanding of personhood and personal identity, she says, "the fact that biological, psychological, and social continuities are intertwined is seen as a complication which makes it difficult to determine which relation constitutes continuation" (p. 150) On "the property cluster model," by contrast, "the integrated functioning is the true nature of the relation that constitutes the conditions of our continuation" (p. 150). Since this new model more accurately reflects the empirical reality of what it is to be a person she regards "The existence of the individual types of continuity in their 'pure' form" as "a degenerate case of the more basic relation that contains all three" (p. 150).

This characterization of the difference between what Schechtman is offering and the way business is usually done in the analytic literature on personhood and personal identity seems accurate to me. So far as I know, none of the traditional analytic understandings of personhood and personal identity are as inclusive or holistic as her person life view. None is as attentive to the nitty-gritty of actual human lives. For these reasons her account provides the best answer I have read to what might be called the humanistic question of what it is to be a person and to persist over time. In other words, she tries to grasp what it actually is to be a person, rather than abstracting away from the dynamic complexity of that in order to build a theory based on some important characteristics of persons. As a consequence, if some creature new to our planet, but with an internal psychology and sensibilities closely analogous to our own, wanted to know what human persons are and why anyone should be interested in them, so far as the analytic philosophical literature on personal identity is concerned, he or she could do no better than to consult Schechtman's view.

There is much more in Schechtman's rich account than I have space to survey in this brief review. I will mention just two additional things, both of which, I think, are likely to draw the attention of students of personal identity. The first of these is that she offers her new account not only as an empirically and practically based modification of traditional analytic accounts but also as a way of understanding "the ontology of everyday objects" (p. 184). To make this out, she argues, first, primarily in opposition to Eric Olson's version of animalism, that it is not implausible to claim that persons, but not animals, are substances and, second, that even if persons are not substances "we are in fact more fundamentally persons than human animals," and so it is our being persons, not our being animals, "that sets the conditions of our literal continuation" (p. 198). Schechtman's subtle defense of these claims is too complicated to summarize in any detail here, let alone criticize. For those who are interested, it is well worth the time it may take to work one's way through it.

A second thing that is central to Schechtman's positive account is her claim that human persons are "unified loci of interaction" that "are constituted by the activities that make up their characteristic lives," and that as such they have "the integrity of a unified locus which we can track and interact with as a single unit" (171, 178, 184, 196-98). Her view seems to be that while the specific nature of this unity is perhaps too dynamic and complicated to characterize in detail (hence, homeostatic property clusters), it is nevertheless what constitutes the core of our personal identities. While this may be true, more, I think, needs to be said about the sort of unity that is involved in a unified locus of interaction. For instance, in response to David Shoemaker's suggestion that there may be not a unified way of characterizing the relation between personal identity and our practical concerns, Schechtman replies:

The claim that we do not need to conceive of an ultimate locus to which the full range of our questions and concerns about a person are addressed, however, does not ring true to the experience of how we relate to the people who make up our social world. We know others as unified (albeit ridiculously complex and multi-faceted) individuals. This is most evident when we think of the people with whom we are most intimate and therefore engage along many practical dimensions. The son I feed and clothe and comfort is the same person I chastise for behaving badly to his sister and the same person to whom I try to teach the value of hard work and explain the benefit of making small sacrifices now for larger benefits later. He is also the same person whose straight As bring me pride and whose disappointments are a cause for my sadness, and the person whose health I am concerned to safeguard. I do not have a moral son and an animal son and a psychological son -- I have a single son who has all of these aspects and is important to me in all of these ways. Similarly it would be absurd for a doctor to tell a worried husband that his animal wife survived the stroke, and perhaps his sentient wife, but probably not his moral or rational agent wife. (p. 83)

But even conceding Schechtman's characterization of how we relate to the people who make up our social world there remain questions about what the expression "ultimate locus" actually means and about how as persons these loci are unified. If I know that my son is the ultimate locus of questions and concerns about him, what is it exactly that I know? And, in knowing it, how much do I know about personhood and personal identity? For instance, do I know that he must be unified in the appropriate way? And what way exactly might that be?

One way to flesh out the answer to such questions would be to look in more detail than Schechtman does at the sorts of disunity that might undermine something as a potential locus of practical interactions. She mentions fission as one such sort of disunity: "a person is, by definition, a unified locus of our person-related concerns, and there is no such unified locus where concerns are spread between two individuals" (p. 159). Perhaps one could have fission without practical concerns being disrupted if it was unknown that fission had occurred and the fission products were isolated from each other. In this case, I think she would say, the focus of our practical concerns would not itself be properly unified. But even when the fission products are known to exist and are central to one's life, it seems that there are ways in which they could be integrated into one's life that wouldn't disrupt our, or their, practical unity (see, for instance, my example of "fission rejuvenation" in Self-Concern (1998)). Quite apart from hypothetical examples of fission, isn't the joint activity of more than one person sometimes the "locus" of our practical concerns, as in our interest in a string quartet? Does it lack the right sort of unity because more than one person is involved? What about individuals that have one or another sort of mental illnesses -- schizophrenia, depersonalization, and extreme dissociative disorders come to mind -- that seem to at least compromise their unity as persons, yet do not preclude them from being the unified focus of our concerns? In other words, even if Schechtman is right that there is a practical unity that underlies our ability to track persons in practical ways, that this unity takes the form of a homeostatic property cluster, and that it is what we most fundamentally are, might we still not ask for a more detailed account of what constitutes this unity?

I don't mean to suggest that Schechtman has entirely neglected the question of what kind of unity is the central feature of persons. It is rather that most of her effort is devoted to proving that there is such a unity and to arguing that it is not explained properly by focusing on the central features of traditional accounts of personhood and personal identity. She goes some way toward working out what this unity consists in by employing the notion of homeostatic property clusters. She briefly alludes to other aspects of this unity. Nevertheless, it seems to me that the notion never really gets the attention it deserves. This is not to say that anything she says is mistaken. It's rather to say that working out a more detailed account of the nature of this central unity might lead to an empirically richer account of what lies at the heart of the sort of personal identity that matters most to most of us in our practical lives. In other words, it would be a constructive way to build on her account, which to her credit is eminently worthy of further development.