A Logical Foundation for Potentialist Set Theory

Logical Foundation Potentilist

Sharon Berry, A Logical Foundation for Potentialist Set Theory, Cambridge University Press, 2022, 240pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108834315.

Reviewed by John P. Burgess, Princeton University


The central project of the book under review, occupying the first half of the text, has three components: (I) A critique of mainstream approaches to set theory (with which the book presupposes some familiarity, as will this review), approaches that assume the actual existence of a full cumulative hierarchy of sets, satisfying the axioms of ZFC. (II) The introduction of a new modality, conditional logical possibility. (III) Its use to produce a paraphrase of ZFC (inspired by but improving on the earlier work of Hillary Putnam and Geoffrey Hellman) requiring only the potential existence of (structures isomorphic to) bigger and bigger parts of the cumulative hierarchy, namely, the initial segments called V(α) in the literature, for larger and larger ordinals α. The technicalities come mainly in Part II of the book, with the most highly technical relegated to appendices at the back of the book or online.[1] There is much dense material here, but at least it seems clean and clear of typos.[2] The second half of the text collects what might have been independent papers on side-topics related in varying degrees to the central project. There is interesting matter here, but word limits require me to pass over this part of the work, to focus on (I)-(III).

(I) Critique. Let me summarize Sharon Berry’s three main objections to orthodox set theory. I will also suggest how the orthodox set theorist might reply, but even if such replies ultimately succeed, the heterodox objections will at least have served to motivate the positive project to come. First, orthodox expositions affirm that the cumulative hierarchy is maximally wide and maximally high. Berry’s quarrel is not with the width idea but with the height idea. She claims there is a certain indefiniteness to it, and a certain arbitrariness: Why does the hierarchy stop just where it does? The orthodox set theorist will reject the question on the grounds that the hierarchy doesn’t stop, and will not deny the indefiniteness, but make a virtue of it: The thought that the hierarchy is indefinitely high suggests that anything we say in an attempt to define how high it is will inevitably be an understatement, already true at some initial segment V(α). This in turn suggests certain so-called reflection principles, the most basic of which is equivalent to the important ZFC axiom of Replacement, and the more advanced of which suggest going beyond ZFC to certain large cardinal axioms.

Berry’s second complaint is that while we would hope for a set theory that would allow any structure of mathematical interest to be modeled set-theoretically, “actualism” posits a structure, the whole cumulative hierarchy, that is too large to be isomorphic to any set-theoretic model. What is to be said about this? Well, one can’t always get what one hopes for: Frege hoped for a class of all classes and category theorists have hoped for a category of all categories; but experience shows such things are not easily obtainable. Cantor very early warned that some pluralities of things, “consistent multiplicities,” can form sets and be assigned transfinite cardinal numbers, but others, “inconsistent multiplicities,” do not form sets and are “absolutely infinite.” A half-century later, with Ernst Zermelo’s cumulative hierarchy picture, it becomes clear what makes the difference: Given some sets, if there is an upper bound to the levels at which they appear, they form a set; if they go “all the way up,” they do not. The paradoxes of Russell and Cesare Burali-Forti, catastrophes for Frege’s top-down theory of Umfänge, are merely illustrations of this core bottom-up feature of Cantorian-Zermelodic Mengenlehre.

Berry’s third complaint is the old one of George Boolos that the cumulative hierarchy picture fails to motivate all the axioms of ZFC. Here it may be granted that Extensionality is more presupposed than implied by the picture, and while the maximal width idea rules out definability restrictions such as those that have motivated most objections against Choice, this is not really a positive argument for Choice. But Berry’s main objection is that we don’t get a derivation of Replacement from principles that “seem clearly true,” leaving even the consistency of ZFC in doubt. The orthodox set theorist would insist that at least we have inductive evidence of consistency in the failure over many years to find any contradiction (whereas with Frege’s and other set-theories that have been found inconsistent, the contradictions emerged in very short order). And Gödel’s famous second incompleteness theorem (which Berry surprisingly omits to discuss or even mention) imposes severe limits on what we can expect in the way of consistency proofs. Still, there are various different routes to motivating Replacement, several of which Berry surveys, and the distance between what one needs to assume and what one is trying to derive varies from route to route, as does the plausibility of the starting point; so, there is value just in having different routes leading to the same destination mapped out for us. I will leave the reader who tackles Berry’s work to judge whether her route (which I have not yet sketched) gets us from a more clearly-true-seeming assumption to the desired ZFC axiom than does, say, the route from reflection principles.

Also to be compared to her route is the actual historical path by which set theorists historically came to accept the axiom, as described by Akihiro Kanamori (2012), who declares  “Mathematics is . . . alone competent to address issues of its correctness and authority,” (82) an attitude very different from that of many philosophers. And there is yet another route, which Kanamori attributes to Adrian Mathias and construes as an expression of mathematicians’ “indifference to identification,” more famously witnessed by their indifference to which of many isomorphic structures gets called “the natural numbers.” Ordered pairs (a, b) can be introduced into set theory by various identifications, the best known being these:

            (1)       { {a, Ø}, {b, {Ø}} }

            (2)       { {a}, {a, b} }

From either of these, or any of many other definitions, one can derive the basic laws of pairs:

            (3)       (a, b) = (c, d) if and only if a = c and b = d

For the two definitions exhibited we can prove, without use of Replacement, that the Cartesian product

            (4)       A ⊗ B = {(a, b): aA & bB}

exists for any sets A and B. According to Mathias, Replacement is equivalent to the assumption that for any definition of pairing satisfying the basic law (3), Cartesian products (4) exist.

(II) Modality. Let us begin by taking the diamond ◊ of modal logic to represent logical possibility. In the second sentence of the book Berry says is that “we seem to grasp a notion of logical possibility prior to, and independent from . . . set-theoretic models.” This is clearly true: set-theoretic model-theory is less than a century old, going back to Alfred Tarski in the 1930s, while the notion of logical possibility or consistency goes back to antiquity, and Tarski himself intended his analysis to be judged by its fidelity to pre-existing ideas. A famous discussion by Georg Kreisel (the “squeezing” argument) shows that Tarski’s notion is not intensionally correct, precisely because it ignores structures like the full cumulative hierarchy that are “too big,” but nonetheless is extensionally correct, thanks to Gödel’s completeness theorem.

More dubious is Berry’s claim that logical possibility can be taken as a primitive notion, not learned from any definition or explanation of what it is supposed to amount to, but rather by “immersion” (49). But we don’t communicate the notion to students in intro logic by “immersion,” just throwing examples and counterexamples at them and hoping they will divine the principle at work. Rather, the notion has traditionally been explained in terms of logical form: a statement is logically possible or consistent if its form alone does not guarantee that it is false. That is why when nominalists like Hartry Field and Geoffrey Hellman help themselves to logical possibility as a primitive for use in nominalistic projects of eliminating abstract entities, grave doubts arise. For may they not be implicitly helping themselves to notions like logical form, and may not logical forms themselves be abstract entities? This at least is not a problem for Berry, who is no nominalist: Her objections are against set theory specifically, not abstract entities generally.

Perhaps the most important contribution of the book is Berry’s bringing forward in her §4.2 a new notion of conditional logical possibility. She wants to use it to help achieve what Hellman wanted, but without his use of de re logical modalities or of such surrogates for second-order logic as plural logic. But it seems clear that other uses might be found for the new notion as well. Her notation ◊RΦ for this notion reads as something like “it is logically possible, given the structural facts about how the relation R applies, that Φ.” To give us a way not just of pronouncing but of understanding the notation, she offers a few examples (which I found to stop short of illustrating just how much the way things are can change compatibly with “structural facts”) and a few heuristic suggestions involving such apparatus as Kripke models, Stewart Shapiro’s ante rem structures, and the like (accompanied by insistence that the suggestions are not be taken too literally, since her official view remains that her modality is a primitive learned by immersion). Let me make one more attempt, based on the understanding of consistency as a matter of form.

Form being in the first instance a feature of linguistic formulations, we should not speak of consistency with facts but rather with statements of facts. To state the facts about how a relation R applies, one can do the following: Introduce a predicate R for the relation R, and a constant b for each object b in the “field” of that relation (each object related by R to at least one other object). Write down the conjunction (which will be infinitary if the field of R is infinite) of the following:

            (5)       b ≠ c for all distinct b and c in the field of R

            (6)       Rbc for all b and c in its field that are related by R

            (7)       ¬Rbc for all b and c in its field that are not related by R

            (8)       the statement that the field of R contains no objects but those named:

                        ∀x ( (∃y Rxy v ∃y Ryx) → (x = b v x = c v…))

Give this conjunction the name Δ(R). I believe it may be said to describe “how R applies” and that Berry’s conditional possibility operator can be defined thus:

            (9)       ◊RΦ ≡ ◊(Δ(R) & Φ)

A model of Δ(R) would involve a certain relation R* interpreting the symbol R, whose field will consist precisely of the objects b*, c*, . . . interpreting the symbols b, c, . . . , with R* being isomorphic to the original R. I believe this may be what “preserving the structural facts about how R applies” amounts to.

A crucial observation of Berry’s is that her modality can provide surrogates for second-order logic. For instance, we can say that R is a well ordering by adding to the usual definition of order this clause:

            (10)     ¬◊R¬[∃x(x is blessed) → ∃x(x is blessed & ¬∃y(Ryx & y is blessed))]

Any other one-place predicate such as “accursed” could replace “blessed” in (10). Now the conditions on a relation E that make it isomorphic to the elementhood relation ∈ on some V(α) cannot be expressed in first-order terms, but can be expressed in second-order terms. So we can say that E is such a relation by saying ¬◊E¬Φ for some suitable Φ.

(III) Paraphrase. From this point my sketch of Berry’s project must become ever sketchier. The ultimate idea, close to one that has come up in previous, usually nominalistic projects, is to interpret “for every set x, there is a set y, such that . . . ” by “for every x in every structure isomorphic to a V(α), there is a y in some structure isomorphic to a V(β) where β > α, such that . . . ,” but saying this last statement using conditional logical modalities nested as the quantifiers ∀x∃y are nested, rather than with the apparatus used by Hellman or earlier precursors. The result is that a statement ostensibly expressed in terms of quantification over actual sets gets paraphrased as a modal statement.

Of course, we want to be able not merely to paraphrase theorems of ZFC but to prove these paraphrases in our new set-up. That comes down to formulating modal axioms that will imply the paraphrases of the axioms of ZFC, crucially including Replacement. In this one respect at least Berry’s project resembles David Lewis’s “megethology,” which seeks to formulate principles, not of modality but of mereology, from which paraphrases of set-theoretic axioms can be deduced. If we look at the principle of Ludovician mereology that gives us Replacement (in his jargon, “if there is a function from atoms of x to all atoms of y, then y is small if x is”), we find it disappointingly similar to what we are seeking to derive from it. In terms of distance from starting point to finish line, Berry’s proposal is somewhere between the extremes of the reflection or pairing example and the megethology example. How it fares as to plausibility of starting point, readers must judge for themselves. It is only to be expected that, as with most significant novelties, when her contributions are absorbed and become familiar, her derivations may be considerably streamlined and simplified. But then familiarity and simplicity may alter our view of the distance from her assumption of “Amalgamation” (8.13 on p100) to the axiom of Replacement that is derived from it.

I have just space enough left to mention the two among her many side-topics that I find most closely connected with Berry’s main project: (i) Criticism of a rival “potentialist” line of Charles Parsons, Øystein Linnebo, and James Studd (chapter 5). This does seem to me liable to Berry’s “arbitrariness” objection: Why do the outright actual sets end and the merely potential sets begin where they do? Berry’s own project does not raise such doubts because she affirms neither the actual nor the potential existence of sets, but only the potential existence of objects arranged in the way the sets in initial segments of the cumulative hierarchy are supposed to be arranged.  (ii) Criticism of the “multiverse” idea of Joel Hamkins, which does for width something like what Berry does for height (section 18.4). But to repeat what I said at the outset, there is much more in the book than I have been able to discuss.


Kanamori, Akihiro, “In Praise of Replacement,” Bulletin of Symbolic Logic, vol.18 (2012), pp. 46–90.

[1] Go to www.cambridge.org/PotentialistSetTheory and click on the “resources” button.

[2] In a private communication the author has pointed out one bad one: on p.96, in axiom 8.6, the box should be a diamond.