Stich and His Critics

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Dominic Murphy and Michael Bishop (eds.), Stich and His Critics, Wiley-Blackwell, 2009, 268pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405112062.

Reviewed by José Luis Bermúdez, Washington University in St. Louis



Stephen Stich has been one of the most significant and widely-cited contributors to philosophy of mind and philosophy of psychology in the last 30 years. His methodological influence has been just as significant as his individual contributions. Stich is a key figure in the move away from traditional philosophical concerns with analyzing concepts and a priori theory-building to an active engagement with empirical data and scientific theories. He has pursued a naturalizing agenda through his individual publications, many collaborations, and extensive editorial work. The papers in this collection, the fourteenth in the Philosophers and their Critics series edited by Ernest Lepore, bear witness to the fecundity of Stich’s contributions to the discipline, while his replies to the individual papers bear witness to his dialectical skills.

The ten papers in the volume can be divided into three main groups. The first group (including the papers by Frank Jackson, Michael Devitt, Peter Godfrey-Smith, and Frances Egan) tackles the much-discussed eliminativism about propositional attitude psychology that Stich first proposed in From Folk Psychology to Cognitive Science: The Case Against Belief (1983) and then modified and developed in later publications, including Deconstructing the Mind (1996). Papers in the second group (represented by Fiona Cowie, Kim Sterelny, Jesse Prinz, and Alvin Goldman) focus on general questions of cognitive architecture. The first three authors in this group pursue the topic of nativism, the subject of Stich’s first edited collection, while Goldman defends his version of the simulation theory of mindreading. Finally, the papers by Ernest Sosa and Michael Bishop tackle some of Stich’s provocative metaphilosophical claims.

In the general context of eliminativism, Godfrey-Smith and Egan each explore the widespread practice in the cognitive sciences of invoking representations. Godfrey-Smith presents a form of representationalism derived from model-based conceptions of scientific understanding. There is, he argues, an important place for representationalist models in cognitive science, but these models are most productive when they incorporate a consumer or reader mechanism. As he puts it, "Information is everywhere. But information-use is not everywhere" (p. 39). This is a useful corrective to standard ways of thinking about representations and representational content (in terms, for example, of causation and covariation). Egan also focuses on the role of representations in cognitive science explanation. There is no place, she suggests, for semantic considerations in the individuation of computational mechanisms. Computational mechanisms are individuated in mathematical terms. Representations, however, come into the picture when we try to understand why a particular computation amounts to the exercise of a cognitive capacity. These subpersonal computational representations are very different from the personal-level representations about which Stich was so skeptical in 1983, but Egan argues that personal-level propositional attitudes have a role to play in other areas of cognitive science, such as developmental psychology and attribution theory.

Jackson and Devitt focus more directly on Stich’s explicit discussion of eliminativism, particularly on his account of the connection between eliminativism and the theory of reference. To fill in the background here: Stich’s original arguments rested upon a tacit appeal to a descriptive theory of meaning. He argued, in effect, that since many of our beliefs about beliefs are false, the term “belief” fails to refer. As Bill Lycan and other commentators have remarked, however, the argument fails on views of reference (such as Putnam’s) that allow terms to refer even when we are largely mistaken about the things that they pick out. In Deconstructing the Mind, Stich acknowledged this objection, but tried to deflect it by claiming there is no single correct account of reference (as opposed to a range of different word-world relations, each of which serves a different theoretical purpose) — and hence that there is no correct answer to the truth or falsity of eliminativism.

Jackson and Devitt both take issue with Stich’s meta-claim about reference. Devitt shares Stich’s skepticism about the type of semantic ascent that shifts ontological questions to questions about reference, but is unconvinced by the proposed grounds, particularly Stich’s rejection of a proto-scientific approach to reference (an approach that aims for an account both of how the relation of reference can be scientifically characterized and of how it is exploited within science). For Devitt the place of reference in science is given by the centrality of truth-conditional semantics in linguistics and other approaches to language. Although he thinks that the prospects for a proto-scientific account of reference are rosier than Stich grants, Devitt thinks that we should do metaphysics directly without a detour through semantics. Nevertheless, before setting out on this endeavor I think it would be wise to review the penetrating criticisms Stich raises in his Replies.

Jackson, in contrast, tackles Stich’s challenge head-on. He accepts that different word-world relations can be relevant in different contexts, but claims that only some of these relations are relevant in ontological contexts — “those needed to capture what we assert using sentences that capture what we think” (p. 71). These reference relations tie words to objects and properties so as to allow sentences to code indefinitely many different belief contents as a function of their compositional structure. Jackson’s proposal has intuitive appeal, but seems prone to significant objections. As Stich remarks in his Replies, it remains open to eliminativists to formulate their arguments in foro interno, so that the whole question of what we assert using sentences does not arise. In any event, since Jackson’s argument rests heavily upon the demands of assertion and communication, this seems to allow the skeptical meta-claim to be reformulated at the level of thought: how are we to determine which of the many possible thought-world relations is relevant for settling ontological questions?

It is certainly true that as Stich has become more directly engaged with scientific psychology and cognitive science, he has become much less of an eliminativist — somewhat ironically, since his original arguments exploited perceived tensions between folk psychology and the scientific study of the mind. The “boxological” information-processing models that he has developed with various collaborators make free reference to “belief-boxes”, “desire-boxes”, and other theoretical devices not available to the die-hard eliminativist about folk psychology. Moreover, Stich has been an important figure in interdisciplinary discussions about the nature of mindreading — or what philosophers might think of as the exercise of our folk psychological understanding of other minds and the springs of action. This takes us onto the second group of papers, since this is the topic of Goldman’s contribution to the volume. Goldman is an exponent of the simulationist approach to modeling mindreading, and his contribution takes Stich to task for allegedly neglecting evidence from cognitive neuroscience in Mindreading (co-authored with Shaun Nichols). Allowing the dust to settle, the end result of this slightly barbed exchange seems to be that much of the evidence Goldman discusses is not directly relevant to the high-level, folk psychological mindreading discussed by Stich and Nichols, although a fair amount of relevant material has emerged since they finished work on their book.

The relation between folk theories and philosophy is a recurrent theme in this collection. It comes to the fore in an explicitly methodological sense in Sosa’s paper, which defends analytic epistemology’s appeal to epistemic intuitions (folk epistemology?) against Stich’s critique. Elements of this critique have their source in an early version of what is now known as experimental philosophy (another development in the philosophy of psychology behind which Stich looms large). Stich and others have run surveys suggesting that many of the intuitions dear to the heart of traditional epistemologists are less widely shared than commonly imagined. Sosa points out, surely quite correctly, that this (rather sketchy) data has been incautiously interpreted. In arguing the way he does, however, Sosa does seem to concede Stich’s main point, which is that epistemologists (and other armchair philosophers) are hostages to empirical fortune, and that the best way to resolve the uncertainty is by systematic testing of intuitive responses to epistemic problem cases. Opponents of experimental philosophy will no doubt be dismayed by this.

Stich’s own epistemological views tend towards the pragmatic. He enjoins us to opt for cognitive and epistemic strategies that best help us achieve the things that we intrinsically value. In opposition to Stich’s strong suspicion that truth is not widely valued on its own terms, Bishop thinks that we cannot avoid favoring the truth-apt over the non-truth-apt. We are, he thinks, natural-born reliabilists and, for that very reason, we have pragmatic reasons to be reliabilists. Stich, however, remains unconvinced by this pragmatic argument for reliabilism. He is confident in his own ability knowingly to adopt a particular cognitive strategy over a more truth-apt alternative and strongly suspects that he is not unique in this. Perhaps we should call in the experimental philosophers to adjudicate?

Three papers in the collection focus on nativism. Sterelny’s paper discusses nativism about mindreading. Many psychologists and cognitive scientists play fast and loose with the idea of innateness, which often goes hand in hand with ideas about modularity and domain-specific information-processing. Sterelny claims that the empirical case for nativism is significantly underdetermined. Developmental invariance and poverty of the stimulus arguments are not compelling. He recruits the Stich-Nichols model of mindreading to argue that the data to which nativists appeal can be accommodated within a non-nativist framework (or rather, within a framework that holds only “shallow” quasi-perceptual modules to be innately specified).

Stich, in his reply, worries that Sterelny has been wrestling a straw man and claims to be unable to think of a single nativist about mindreading. Similar issues about focus and set-up affect Prinz’s contribution to the collection. Prinz takes several different formulations of nativist claims about morality and subjects each of them to a barrage of apparently countervailing data from a wide range of sources including psychology, anthropology, and ethology. This all supports, he claims, the view that morality is a spandrel — a by-product of capacities that evolved for other purposes. The force of Prinz’s argument is blunted, though, by a certain fuzziness about how the key concepts of moral norm and moral rule are being understood. As Stich points out in his reply, this is a problem endemic in many ongoing discussions of moral psychology.

Cowie explores, on Stich’s behalf, the question of why someone so tempted towards eliminativism and general iconoclasm should have remained untempted by eliminativism about the concept of nativism. As she persuasively illustrates, recent (and not-so-recent) attempts to clarify what exactly the nativist claim amounts to are strikingly unsuccessful. The stage seems set for what she calls “It’s a Mess” eliminativism. But we shouldn’t be too quick to reject scientifically useful concepts simply because they resist clear analysis, she continues. Think what would have happened if we had done that with gene, say, or element. Much crucial research into genes and chemical elements was framed by a conceptual understanding that many reflective participants and commentators realized to be muddled and perhaps incoherent. Nevertheless, she argues, the end results justify the lack of conceptual fastidiousness.

Cowie’s claims raise questions that intersect in interesting ways with topics covered elsewhere in the volume, particularly the issues in the theory of reference discussed by Jackson and Devitt. What grounds do we have for thinking that the things about which important discoveries have been made are the referents of the muddled concepts widespread prior to those discoveries? It is unclear whether Cowie, in order to mount her guarded defense of what she terms Stich’s “non-elimiNativism”, needs to hold onto a most un-Stichian conception of a uniquely privileged reference relation holding between, say, our concept innateness and a property of some cognitive mechanisms and bodies of knowledge that she hopes will be coherently articulated in the future.

This is just one example of a fruitful link between topics that seem on the face of it to be rather disparate. Stich has worked in many different areas, but there are certain constant themes. Readers of this collection will enjoy seeing them crop up in different contributions and in Stich’s replies. They will also be impressed by how the ten contributors between them only seem to manage to land a few light jabs. Many of the roundhouse punches miss completely, while others are skillfully deflected, and in his Replies Stich lands some powerful counterpunches of his own. Although a powerful opponent of traditional ways of doing philosophy, Stich remains a fully paid-up exponent of the traditional philosophical virtues of clarity and rigor.