Sticks and Stones: The Philosophy of Insults

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Jerome Neu, Sticks and Stones: The Philosophy of Insults, Oxford University Press, 2008, 292pp., $37.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195314311.

Reviewed by Macalester Bell, Columbia University


In the spring of 2007, during an on-air discussion of the NCAA championship, radio talk show host Don Imus infamously described the Rutgers women's basketball team as bunch of "nappy-headed ho's." Two days later, facing public outrage over his remarks, Imus apologized for insulting the team:

[I] want to take a moment to apologize for an insensitive and ill-conceived remark we made the other morning regarding the Rutgers women's basketball team … . It was completely inappropriate and we can understand why people were offended. Our characterization was thoughtless and stupid, and we are sorry.[1]

He later explained what he had learned about appropriate targets of insult: "Here's what I've learned: that you can't make fun of everybody, because some people don't deserve it."[2] Despite his apologies and explanations, Imus was eventually fired from his radio program for his comments. Imus' insult and its aftermath raise a number of fundamental questions about the nature of insult: what is insult? Can insults harm their targets? If so, what is the nature of this harm? Is this the sort of harm that the state should attempt to prevent through the prohibition of certain kinds of speech? What is the connection between insult and humor? Are some insults justified and others unjustified? Can someone ever have "standing" to insult another? How should we respond to those who unfairly insult others?

Jerome Neu's book, Sticks and Stones: The Philosophy of Insults, provides a wide-ranging, original, and fascinating introduction to the many philosophical questions raised by insult. Neu's comprehensive discussion of insult encompasses everything from the nature of insult, to the history of dueling, to contemporary insult rituals, to the insults traded in some of Shakespeare's great works, to the nature of obscenity, to campus speech codes, to the laws regarding blasphemy, defamation, and fighting words, and much more. Neu could be described as a methodological pluralist, and he approaches his discussion of insult from the perspectives of philosophy, sociology, anthropology, history, psychoanalysis, and legal theory.

Spanning ten chapters, Neu's book covers a great deal of ground. Rather than attempt an exhaustive summary of his arguments, I will say a bit about what I take to be the three most general themes of the book: (1) the nature of insult; (2) the role of insult in our social lives; (3) the role of insult in the law.

Insult always involves at least two people: the insulted and the insulter (the audience to the insult may also play an important role in certain insult rituals). Neu describes the basic distinction between insulting and being insulted as follows: "To insult is to assert or assume dominance, either intentionally claiming superiority or unintentionally revealing lack of regard. To be insulted is to suffer a shock, a disruption of one's sense of self and one's place in the world" (vii). As this passage makes clear, Neu thinks that one can insult another even if one lacks the intention to insult so long as one's behavior reveals a lack of appropriate regard for the object of insult.

Having marked the basic distinction between insulting and being insulted, Neu goes on to give an account of what it is to be insulted. Neu begins his analysis of being insulted by considering the phenomenology of feeling insulted. At the heart of feeling insulted is the shock and psychological pain associated with disappointed expectations of respect: "Insult at its broadest level involves failures (whether intentional or unintentional, conventional or idiosyncratic) of respect" (235). Neu argues that the expectations that are disappointed in insult are normative rather than predictive expectations; that is, they are expectations having to do with how we should be treated. When these expectations are disappointed, most people experience shock and pain commingled with a range of emotions. This is what it is to feel insulted. Neu is careful to point out that the emotions that partially constitute feeling insulted will vary with the relevant background conditions and social conventions. The emotions associated with insult include "wounded pride … humiliation, shame, embarrassment, guilt, anger, and on indefinitely" (31).

Despite the attention Neu gives to the experience of feeling insulted, he argues that feeling insulted is not the same thing as being insulted. Clearly some people are overly sensitive and respond with shock when unjustified expectations are thought to be disappointed. There is, Neu claims, a "more-or-less objective standard that provides a norm for sensitivity" (6). According to these norms, some are overly sensitive and thus may feel insulted without these feelings being justified; when one "properly feels insulted" one feels insulted and this feeling is justified. In addition, there is a further difference between feeling insulted and being insulted: "Being insulted, unlike being jealous and more like being betrayed, is ambiguous. It may refer to either a psychological state or a social condition (which in turn one may or may not be aware of)" (8). Thus, one can be insulted without feeling anything at all. Neu does not attempt to resolve this ambiguity, and, in the end, he insists that whether or not an utterance counts as an insult will depend on our reasons for asking about the conditions of insult. Consider, for example, a case in which a would-be insulter intends for some utterance to insult his target but the target refuses to give the insult uptake and does not feel insulted. Neu insists that there is no one answer to whether or not the utterance in this case is an insult, it all depends on what one is attempting to assess. If one is attempting to assess the speaker's character, then the intention to insult may well be enough for the utterance to count as an insult. But in other sorts of cases, the mere intention to insult may not be sufficient for the utterance to count as an insult. If, for example, we are attempting to assess potential damages, mere intention to insult would not be enough for some utterance to count as an insult.

One of the curious things about insult is that while it is typically an expression of scorn for the person insulted, it may also, under certain circumstances, be an expression of intimacy and even great affection. This brings us to the second general theme of Neu's book: the role of insult in our social lives. As Neu points out, we often reserve our insults for our closest associates as a (rather puzzling) mark of intimacy. Sometimes, these insults between intimates are not taken personally because contextual factors serve to mark the insult as being part of a larger insult ritual such as the dozens. The dozens is an insult ritual involving two main participants who take turns insulting each other in front of an audience of their peers. The dozens is a highly structured ritual; there are norms concerning both the content of the insults exchanged (e.g., they are very often about taboo subjects) and the style in which the insults are expressed (e.g., they are very often expressed in rhyme). Neu argues that insult rituals such as the dozens are adolescent contests for honor. While the exact nature of these insult rituals is shaped by social conditions, Neu suggests that insult rituals are ubiquitous because they serve important psychological functions. Specifically, they are a way of dealing with aggressive impulses and they help participants to establish a masculine identity (Neu points out that women are not usually participants in the dozens and other insult rituals).

In addition to insult rituals like the dozens, insult has an important role to play in less structured teasing relationships and many different forms of humor. Informal teasing and joking between friends allows individuals to play with and push the boundaries of respect without risking valued relationships. In addition, we often use satire and insult humor to criticize public figures. However, Neu insists that there are certain limits on the appropriate objects of satire and insult humor:

The ridicule of satire ought arguably to be aimed at the powerful and successful, including politicians and celebrities, people who have put themselves forward for prominence and have some sort of dominance over others. That is, the very people that American libel law, at least since NY Times v. Sullivan, affords less protection from defamation than others. Insult, as the assertion or assumption of dominance, may seem less troublesome when it is an assault on conventional structures of dominance, when it is insult up. (228)

Part of the backlash against Imus' comments regarding the members of the Rutgers basketball team stemmed from the thought that the young women had not put themselves forward for prominence and therefore did not deserve Imus' very public expression of scorn.

The role of insult in the law is the third general theme of the book. In three chapters, Neu discusses several areas of the law that are concerned with insult: fighting words, obscenity, hate speech, defamation, and blasphemy. The basic question he considers throughout these chapters is whether or not the law should protect people from the pain of feeling insulted. The issues here are complex and resist quick summary, but Neu clearly thinks that the potential for offence is usually less dangerous than the harms associated with restricting speech.

As I hope is clear from my description, Sticks and Stones is a remarkably wide-ranging book. Given its scope, there are, unsurprisingly, a few issues that merit more attention than they are given in the book. One question that Neu repeatedly touches on but does not discuss in much detail is whether, and under what conditions, insults may be fitting or appropriate. Imus eventually came to see (or at least say) that his insulting description of the Rutgers women's basketball team was undeserved or unfitting, but it is not clear how to distinguish between fitting and unfitting insults. Neu suggests that insults can be deserved or fitting "where the disappointed expectations are presumptuous, and insulting is a proper putting of someone in their place, a puncturing of pretensions" (95). While this goes some way toward answering the question of what makes an insult fitting, much more could be said. Perhaps one way of getting a handle on whether or not an insult is fitting or unfitting would be to consider the fundamental attitude expressed through insult: contempt. While Neu offers a subtle description of the types of attitudes and emotions that partially constitute feeling insulted, he says comparatively little about the sorts of attitudes and emotions expressed by insult. Clearly the fundamental attitude expressed through insult is contempt. Given that an insult expresses contempt for its object, one way of approaching the question of whether or not an insult could be fitting would be by taking up the question of whether or not expressing contempt for another could itself ever be fitting.

Assuming that some insults are unjustified or unfitting, one might wonder how we, as targets or bystanders, ought to respond to inappropriate insults. Neu suggests that the only ways to avoid the pain of feeling insulted is to become either servile or arrogant. The servile person has such a low sense of himself that he either has no expectations that could be disappointed, or he expects to be mocked and treated poorly. Either way, the servile person is immune from the shock of the disappointed normative expectations that partially constitutes feeling insulted. The arrogant person, on the other hand, simply doesn't notice (or care about) the opinions of others and therefore does not experience the shock of disappointed normative expectations. Clearly becoming servile in the face of unjustified insults is out of the question and Neu also rules out arrogance as a way of avoiding the pain of feeling insulted: "such arrogance, such excessive self-regard, may unfit one for ordinary human relations and sympathy" (28). There is a mean in the domain of feeling insulted; Neu thinks we should strive to be neither overly sensitive nor invulnerable to insult.

Neu is right to worry about servility and arrogance as strategies for avoiding feeling insulted. However, it seems to me that much more needs to be said about avoiding the pain of insult, especially when considering how insult operates in societies marred by racist and sexist oppression. For the oppressed are more likely than the non-oppressed to be on the receiving end of insults, and the sorts of insults that target members of oppressed groups would presumably have the potential to cause greater harm than insults that target the non-oppressed. If this is right, then members of oppressed groups must find a strategy for avoiding the pain of feeling insulted by racist or sexist insults. One way of protecting oneself from feeling insulted would be to muster a targeted counter-contempt towards one's insulters. Such a targeted counter-contempt would protect targets from feeling insulted, and it may help victims of racist and sexist insults maintain their sense of self-respect. This targeted counter-contempt is not the same thing as arrogance, and I see no reason to think that this sort of targeted contempt for those who unfairly insult the oppressed would be incompatible with normal human relationships and sympathy.

Finally, the scope of the book means that Neu does not engage in detailed discussions of some key issues. For example, while Neu argues that insults involve a failure of respect for the insulted, and while Neu does consider the question of what respect requires, the structure of the book does not allow for much in the way of engagement with the extensive philosophical literature on respect for persons. Nor does Neu offer a sustained discussion of how the concept of respect is related to the concept of disrespect or how respect and disrespect are related (or not related) to honor and dishonor. Without a detailed discussion of what respect for persons requires, it is difficult to see how one could settle some of the tough moral and legal issues Neu discusses. Take, for example, the debate over hate speech legislation. At the heart of the debate over hate speech legislation are conflicting ideas about whether or not restricting certain kinds of speech is necessary to secure conditions of mutual respect between persons. Thus, a full discussion of the debate concerning hate speech would seem to require a rather robust account of what respect requires in addition to a full discussion of the nature of offensive speech. Neu provides a rich treatment of offensive speech, but more could be said about mutual respect and what respect requires.

Neu's book is lucid, wide-ranging, and provocative, and he has deftly brought together a number of important philosophical issues related to insult. Given its scope and style, Sticks and Stones should appeal to philosophers, legal theorists, sociologists, and anyone who is interested in the all-too-common phenomenon of insult.

[1] "Networks Condemn Remarks Made by Imus," David Carr, New York Times, April 7 2007,, accessed May 25 2008.

[2] "US Radio Host Suspended Over Racist Remarks," Guardian Unlimited, April 10 2007,, accessed May 25 2008.