Stiegler and Technics

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Christina Howells and Gerald Moore (eds.), Stiegler and Technics, Edinburgh University Press, 2013, 296pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780748677023.


Reviewed by Peter Gratton, Memorial University of Newfoundland


This book is one of the most important collections published in Continental philosophy this year, bringing together many important thinkers to produce excellent forays into aesthetics, the nature of the self after deconstruction, political economy, and post-Freudian notions of desire. That this is done while encountering the work of Bernard Stiegler amounts to a certain irony for me. I have reviewed Stiegler's work here before and have been critical of it for among other reasons: (a) his prose is needlessly verbose and makes great claims for its import, yet no one would think it all that radical, for example, to argue that humanity as such broke off from evolution with the invention of technology, or that kids these days should read more, or that "cognitive capitalism" attempts "to control the Id,"1 that is, that advertisers want you to want their products; (b) his political call for resuscitating 19th century republican institutions misses the patriarchal and colonialist enterprises that were intrinsic to those institutions; (c) he writes expansively on topics from political economy to ancient Greek philosophy to the history of letters to evolutionary theory (sometimes in the same sentence), but his choice of sources are often dated and his explanations are at times sloppy concerning contemporary debates that he clearly neglects2; (d) his readings of his philosophical predecessors can at times be less than rudimentary -- for example, saying Foucault hadn't touched on economics, when he had, or that Kant is a democrat -- and his criticisms of them are repetitions that he treats as original, but which have long been debated about these figures, such as his claim that Deleuze's notion of deterritorialization risks a nihilism in which all structures are washed away, leading only to the affirmation of the destruction of all.

Lastly, his repeated political economy depictions of the masses as essentially lobotomized devourers of media is both elitist and misses out the great class distinctions across the globe,3 since his whole take on political economy means that we are in a time of the alienation of consumers, not producers, which makes one wonder how these consumer products appear in the first place. In an excellent contribution to the volume comparing the notion of care in Stiegler and the later work of Foucault, Sophie Fuggle writes:

Stiegler's claim that mnemotechnologies have produced a flattening whereby we are all subject to the same processes of 'proletarianisation' forms part of a larger attempt to think class . . . . However to fail to distinguish adequately between a corporate CEO being worked by the machine and a migrant worker surviving on casual, precarious labor would be reductive and potentially damaging [my emphasis: note the pull back from the full consequences of a charge she herself began] to Stiegler's political project . . . .We should bear in mind that so called 'ubiquitous media' are in fact fully accessible only to a privileged (Western) portion of his 'deterritorialized' globe. (202)

In short, his "rethinking of class" means he's gotten rid of any notion of it. The editors themselves discuss his hermeneutic approach:

In contrast to the patient, diligent deep-readings we have come to expect since Derrida, the image that emerges of Stiegler is perhaps [my emphasis, since a lot of wiggle room is left to back out of this judgment with this one word] of a thinker who zooms in and out of texts, skimming them to fit what he is looking to find -- as if afflicted by the "hyper-attention" he laments as being endemic. The montage style of his tortuously long sentences, which frequently "cut" from one part of the history of philosophy to another, and between contemporary politics, science, and technology, doubtless adds to the sense of reading as if clicking through hyperlinks, laid out by an eclectic, impatient writer. (9)

Rather than the typical Continental volume that acts as a Festschrift, this book opens Stiegler's oeuvre for debate, though, at times, there is a wonderful mise-en-scène of writers couching their criticism as above -- perhaps it's the case that he's wrong and I've given good evidence for this claim, but again, perhaps. For example, the editors add to the above by arguing that their seemingly damning criticisms need not "derail" his project, since "they show Stiegler to be a product of the society whose excesses he is challenging." Well, that's one way to put it.

All of that said, Christina Howells and Gerald Moore are two of the best and most careful interpreters of contemporary Continental philosophy, and they have brought together a collection of writers I have also long respected. In this way, I used my time with this volume to see if these thinkers could lead me to reconsider Stiegler's work -- an answer to which question the reader will no doubt tease out below. The book is divided into five sections, taking up his views on anthropology, aesthetics, psychoanalysis, politics, and pharmacology, respectively. Howells and Moore have come through with a collection most often written clearly (look at the chapter titles and you'll guess the one that stands out as the exception) with the stakes at issue introduced well in each chapter. (One omission is an essay covering Gilbert Simondon explicitly, given his import to Stieger's work, though he is mentioned in numerous essays.) Stiegler may not always be the best reader of others, but the editors have made sure this is not the case for him, and thus we get a set of important contributions to the topics covered.

I cannot possibly treat each of the sixteen chapters in this book, but instead I focus on those chapters that mark their ambivalences over Stiegler's project, as opposed to those that, while adeptly and helpfully, tease out hermeneutically his views. The editors' introduction and the first chapter by Moore set out well Stiegler's intellectual itinerary in some thirty books written in the last twenty years. (The introduction itself should be a template for others: it seamlessly works in what different chapters take up without becoming the tedious laundry list of abstracts found in many such introductions.) They begin by describing Stiegler’s argument that since the early Greeks, there has been a philosophical repression of technÄ“ such as writing that makes philosophy and the logos possible in the first place. This claim largely follows from Derrida's reading of the pharmakon (poison and remedy) of writing in Plato's Phaedrus, but Stiegler extends this to all technological prosthetics, which are necessary for what is dubbed the human, namely the development of culture beyond a previous epoch of biological evolution. It is through writing -- which threatens our own memories -- that we have a material support for cultural production and reproduction. One problem identified by several writers is that the indecidability of the pharmakon in Derrida becomes very decided when it comes to certain technologies of the early 21st century that can for Stiegler only be poisonous. This marks a certain nostalgia throughout his writings, though Moore and Howells in their different essays contest this claim. As Christopher Johnson notes in a fine essay going over his reading of the anthropologist André Leroi-Gourhan, Stiegler accepts the former's "dystopic development of modern humanity" (50).

As Moore picks up in the first chapter, for Stiegler humans’ use of technology differentiates them from animals, who simply live and die, and who, unlike humans, do not have the laws of evolution "suspended" (18). This "adoption of technics" gives rise to "the life of the mind or spirit," and Stiegler differentiates this "adoption" from the "adaptionist ideology of contemporary capitalism," which naturalizes evolutionary modes and makes us what we would be under evolution: "proletarianised 'bêtes', stupid beasts, programmed to aspire to no more than hollowed-out, meaningless survival" (19). Moore writes:

Whatever can be said of man as a physical organism, Stiegler's crucial contention is that esprit evolves technically, rather than biologically -- and that this entails quite a different mechanism of selection: not just accidental variation (mutation), chance survival, and retroactive adaptation, but "imaginary variation" and an anticipation of change that enables us to break with the survival of the fittest. (21)

Contemporary capitalism provides techniques, then, that turn away from adoption and the "possibility of heritage" (24), and Moore and Stiegler fault previous French thinkers, such as Deleuze, for "legitimat[ing] the impression of there being no alternative to an economic regime that promotes dehumanizing values of performance and bestializing stupidity" (26). Having gotten this far, the reader would presume that Stiegler has reified two classic oppositions: between mind and body and between man and animal, a view Moore denies, but I'm less than convinced. "Far from elevating homo sapiens above the rest of the animal world," Moore writes, "his point is that humanity has no essential basis in biology; it is a behavior potentially performable by all kinds of life" (27). In other words, I think he's saying, some animals could perhaps use tools and they then would be human too, but the whole point of critical animal studies has been not to anthropomorphize animals, or to see their existence as a mere shadow of our own.

It's hard to see how this does not repeat a long established set of binaries that cling to any discussion of the human. Moreover, I'm unconvinced that, even if intelligence exists on the basis of and through material technologies, Stiegler isn't just another philosopher privileging the mind over the body, since he equates all embodiment as brute stupidity (and thus his inattention to the way that capitalism operates on the bodies of producers, given his emphasis on intellectual consumption). He also reinstitutes the break between nature (evolutionarily adaptive, animal, bodily, repetitive) and culture (liberating, adoptive, technical, progressing), which is at the heart of his political critiques, not least because his whole account of technology is that this is what allows the human to "transcend," as Moore puts it, natural adaptation. We have read these stories before. As Michael Lewis notes in his own chapter, "Of a Mythical Philosophical Anthropology," where Derrida had rendered the human-animal distinction indecidable, Stiegler has "forced," based on his anthropology, "a kind of opposition between man and the rest of animals" (66). In any event, Moore's essay itself is a compelling engagement with and rejoinder to Deleuze-inspired post-humanist movements, which he argues go precisely in the wrong direction, helping to "invent a world to which humans are increasingly maladapted." Rather, as he puts it well, "Stiegler's solution . . . is to shift philosophy away from the celebration of the end of the human, and onto the earnest construction of a future for humanity" (33). This marks an important political project Moore has underway, begun in his Politics of the Gift: Exchanges in Poststructuralism (Edinburgh University Press, 2011).

Ian James' contribution argues that Stiegler's attention to the evolutionary development of the hand and technology leads him to shunt aside the cerebral. He argues alternatively that we need to wed, so to speak, Stiegler's account with Catherine Malabou's notion of cerebrality in such books as What Should We Do with Our Brain? (Bayard, 2004). As the editors note in an addendum, Stiegler's forthcoming Time and TechnicsVolume 4, promises to take up a reading and critique of Malabou's work. James, for his own part, doesn't do more than hint at what kind of philosophical position would derive from this, other than its forming a "fundamental organology," or how Malabou and Stiegler's different global accounts could be brought together without major impasses.

Serge Trottein's "Technics, or the Fading Away of Aesthetics," critiques Stiegler for denying the important role of aesthetics in Kant, to the point of misreading him. He goes so far as to suggest, playfully, that Stiegler is playing a slight-of-hand with the reader, forever promising an aesthetics, but never quite delivering it (99). As Trottein puts it somewhat obliquely,

Whereas the title of Volume 3 of Technics and Time seems to promise developments on contemporary art and aesthetics, especially cinema, the reader is treated to a variety show . . . by a philosopher performing as an initiator blinded by the mysteries to which he wishes to introduce us" (100).

Patrick Crogan and Martin Crowley extend this thought, arguing that Stiegler's charge about contemporary aesthetics springs from his view that new media, unlike previous ones, produce only passivity on the part of consumers. Stiegler writes:

An immense part of the population is today deprived of any aesthetic experience, entirely subjected as it is to the aesthetic conditioning in which marketing consists, which has become hegemonic for the vast majority [my emphases] of the world's population [clearly not the case, since only 34% of the world has internet access and 1.6 billion people do not even have access to electricity] while the other part of the population, which still has such experiences, has resigned itself to losing those who have sunk into this conditioning. (Cited at 120)

This exclusion forms what Stiegler staggeringly calls a "ghetto," a direct inversion of any normal meaning of the term -- leaving aside racial and historical reasons for wanting to avoid the word -- since these are the people who have access to food, shelter, and the consumable media well beyond that (120). In short, the problem of capitalism today is not degrading poverty in the developing world, or the growing gulf between the have and the have-nots, or its institutionalized racialisms and patriarchy, but "the devastation produced by the aesthetic war which the hegemonic rule of the market has become" (cited at 120). Oliver Davis, in his often scathing contribution, calls this aestheticization of politics for what it is: an elitism that "implies . . . that politics is too messy a business to be left to the very people who are called upon to exercise it in a democracy: ordinary people," since they are those already anaesthetized. Against this background, as Crogan and Crowley note in their separate essays, Stiegler calls for a return of amateur practice, recalling how previous engagements with music required playing songs on the piano, and so on, rather than just passively receiving them over an iPad. Reviving this amateur culture, Stiegler believes, is one means by which we can take the tools consuming us, rather than the other way around, by using them to make movies, and so on, which as anyone who has seen various YouTube channels knows, is a process already underway.

Howells' contribution, like that of her co-editor, is among the best in the book. She pulls together Stiegler's claims that love and desire derive from a "fault of origin," that is, that we have no essential self and rely on the prosthetics of technology for our survival. Following Lacan, Sartre, and Derrida, she writes elegantly about the inelegant fact that our desires can never be properly sated, and that "our existence is permeated by ambivalent objects of desire, objects that give our life meaning but which can, by the same token, destroy us" (144). While noting Stiegler's own misreadings of Lacan, she points out that his work on sublimation -- and how that is blocked by new media technologies -- helps philosophy think a way out of the negative sublimation that is inhibiting processes of individuation (148-9). She also brings together thinkers, such as Sartre, not often thought alongside Stiegler.

Miguel de Beistegui argues that Stiegler's account of sublimation relies too much on Freud's view that our original sexual drives are sublimated in the production of culture, offering that one should first do a genealogy of sexuality and think through how it is linked to political economy, not merely repeat a particular (Freudian) historical instantiation of it. In this way, one can think sublimation as operating as the "expression of a different energy," of a more "impersonal and pre-individual" force than is on offer in Stiegler's Freudian libidinal economy (190-1). In a similar fashion, Richard Beardsworth's essay calls Stiegler to account for another form of reductionism, reading him as another in a line of technological determinists. His "technological re-reading of Freud . . . flattens out the vagaries of human affect . . . preventing a nuanced, comparative account of the relation between contemporary consumerism and normative thought and behavior" (222).

I left this book with a wider understanding of Stiegler's work, as well as of its flaws. Whatever one thinks of his writings, each contributor here makes substantive and important claims about technology, political economy, aesthetics, and so on, with and beyond his writings, so that this collection operates as a front seat to the most pertinent debates in recent Continental philosophy. In this way, the authors mentioned provide the "attention," "care" and attunement to education that marks the central claims of Stiegler's works, if not always its actual performance.

1 Bernard Stiegler, Taking Care of Youth and the Generations (Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 2010), 9.

2 For example, as Richard Beardsworth's chapter notes, Stiegler's political economy is based on the idea that there is over time a decline in the rate of profits for corporations, which leads them more and more to attempt to capture our psyches through media devices. (This repeats Marx's controversial claim about the labor theory of value in chapter 13 of Das Kapital, volume 3.) But the major political economy story, especially since the Reagan-Thatcher years, has been an explosion in corporate profits while wages have remained stagnant. 

3 In my The State of Sovereignty: Lessons from the Political Fictions of Modernity (Albany NY: SUNY Press, 2012), I discuss how Stiegler joins too many other theorists with similar totalizing images of the so-called masses (189-90).