Stoic Ethics: Epictetus and Happiness as Freedom

Placeholder book cover

William O. Stephens, Stoic Ethics: Epictetus and Happiness as Freedom, Continuum, 2007, 178pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826496089.

Reviewed by Ricardo Salles, Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México


Although its title could suggest a comprehensive account of Stoic ethics with an emphasis on Epictetus' contribution, the present book is wholly centered on Epictetus, and early Stoic ethics is cited only when it serves to illuminate particular aspects of his philosophy. Being a lightly edited version of a 1990 doctoral dissertation, the book is intended for the specialist. However, there is no detailed discussion of scholarly literature published from 1990 to 2007 even though the author does include in the bibliography some recent titles, and often refers to them in the footnotes (e.g. Chapter 4, nn. 2, 10, 18, 39, 49, and 54-8). Stephens himself has published more recently on themes he deals with in this book, revising and sharpening some of his earlier ideas (see, for example, Chapter 3: "How does the Stoic love?" and Stephens, "Epictetus on how the Stoic sage loves", Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 14 [1996], 193-210). Nevertheless this monograph contains several insightful and subtle comments on Epictetan and Stoic ethics, and is of interest to anyone looking for a philosophical treatment of certain problems to which they give rise.

The principal themes studied here are (A) the place of the so-called "indifferents" in the pursuit of the good life or eudaimonia, (B) how philanthropy, and love in particular, fits in the good life, and (C) why the only good life is the fully rational one but also why full rationality requires moral obligations to others rather than, for instance, a non-moral life of egoistic self-preservation. Theme (A) is discussed in Chapters 1 and 2. These are devoted, respectively, to why Epictetus excludes externals -- wealth, reputation, friendship, bodily health, etc. -- from the domain of good things (agatha), and to why externals may be, nevertheless, valuable in some sense. This latter question points to a classic potential difficulty in Stoic philosophy. For "[d]oesn't considering [externals] as neither 'good' nor 'bad' but rather as morally 'indifferent' to us precisely invite us to waste no thought on them and cast away all worries about how to treat them?" (48). As is well known Stoicism, from its very beginning, was concerned with this problem. Some of the earliest Stoics, notably Aristo and his followers, held that anything that is neither virtue nor vice, or neither good nor bad, is thereby totally valueless or indifferent. This is a position that goes back to the Cynics. One classic subject of discussion in Epictetan scholarship has been whether Epictetus sympathized with Aristo's position or adopted instead the orthodox Stoic view, held by Zeno the founder of Stoicism and Chrysippus, according to which something may be valuable in a substantive sense and yet indifferent with respect to virtue or vice. Stephens argues for the latter interpretation (see esp. 67-73: externals, being the materials for virtue, have conditional but not intrinsic value). And his treatment of the two components of the problem -- philosophical and philological -- is penetrating. In the course of the argument, Stephens devotes a long section to the vexed issue of how Epictetus' belief in universal fatalism and all-encompassing divine providence is consistent with his thesis that not even god can interfere with our mental activities, especially assent (54-66). This is one of the places readers would have welcomed a discussion of the scholarly literature on the subject, particularly of: Susanne Bobzien's Determinism and Freedom in Stoic Philosophy, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1998, esp. 338-45 (not even cited in the bibliography); A. A. Long's Epictetus: A Stoic and Socratic Guide to Life, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2002, esp. 207-230; and Margaret Graver's "Not even Zeus", Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 25 (2003), 345-61. Also, nowhere in the book is there a detailed account of Epictetus' notion of freedom, eleutheria, even though it is part of the book's subtitle and a major theme in the Discourses (the longest of them -- 4.1 -- is wholly devoted to it).

The issue of how affection to other people fits Stoic practice is the subject of Chapter 3. The argument concentrates on philanthropy and specifically on love: "How does the Stoic love?". According to Stephens,

Epictetus … assumes that if one succeeds in loving a thing, then one must know in fact that it is a good thing. If one cannot discriminate between good, evil, and indifferent things, however, then one will not know what to love. And if one is ignorant of what to love, Epictetus infers that one will not know how to love either. (108)

Insofar as knowledge of the good is exclusive to the Stoic sage, only the Stoic sage truly loves. This is perhaps the most distinctive contribution of the book to Stoic studies even though the definitive version of the argument is presented by Stephens in his 1996 article "Epictetus on how the Stoic sage loves" (cited above).

In Chapter 4, Stephens treats the third major issue -- why the good life (eudaimonia) must be rational and why rationality entails obligations to other people as exemplified in "proper functions" (kathêkonta): respect, fidelity, benevolence, and the like. The connection drawn by Epictetus between eudaimonia and rationality is based on two theses: (a) the good life is the life in accordance with nature, and (b) the life in accordance with nature is the rational life, where "nature" means that which is specific to and characteristic of humans within the scale of nature, namely rationality in the sense of the exercise of the capacity "to understand the universe and to do our best to interpret what its plan for us is" (132, based on Diss. 3.24.35). Stephens' evidence for (b) comes mainly from the Stoic theory of oikeiôsis or "appropriation" (which also provides ground for the connection between rationality and duty to others). The theory of oikeiôsis, however, is not prominent in Epictetus (as is acknowledged by Stephens, see 124). In general, Stephens' account of this theory is not supported by direct textual analysis of primary sources, early or late. It is based instead on the opinion of other scholars, notably Gisela Striker ("The role of oikeiosis in Stoic ethics", Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 1 [1993]) and Troels Engberg-Pedersen ("Discovering the good: oikeiosis and kathekonta in Stoic ethics" in Schofield and Striker, eds., The Norms of Nature, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986). A different, more promising, approach to thesis (b) could have been through the concept of parakolouthêsis, amply attested by Epictetus and central to his theory of rationality and human function (see for instance David Hahm, "A neglected Stoic argument for human responsibility", Illinois Classical Studies 17 [1992], 23-48).

One attractive feature of the book is the author's engagement with general philosophical issues and the frequent comparison he makes between Epictetus and modern thinkers, for example, Erich Fromm (108-9 and 119 n. 9). Stephens' personal opinion on the strengths and weaknesses of Stoic and Epictetan ethics is carefully presented at the end (150-154). From this perspective, and considering also the great clarity with which it is written and the numerous quotations from Epictetus, Stoic Ethics: Epictetus and Happiness as Freedom may be used as a good general introduction to this major Stoic philosopher.