Stoic Pragmatism

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John Lachs, Stoic Pragmatism, Indiana University Press, 2012, 193pp., $25.00 (pbk) ISBN 9780253007216.

Reviewed by Douglas McDermid, Trent University


Most of us have heard about that exemplary fool, Molière's Monsieur Jourdain, who was astonished to discover in middle age that he had been speaking prose all his life. After perusing John Lachs's wise and lively Stoic Pragmatism, many readers will no doubt conclude that they have lived as stoic pragmatists for years without realizing it. For what Lachs offers his readers is nothing less than a philosophy of life in the old-fashioned sense: not a recondite theory or bundle of abstruse arguments, but a vivid and concrete vision by which individuals may steer their practice. And the central thought of this philosophy is simple, sensible, and familiar. On the one hand, we should work hard to improve our lot, to live richer and more rewarding lives; on the other hand, we must always be mindful that the time may come when the best thing we can do is accept that there is nothing we can do. To everything there is a season, and the wise person, according to Lachs's view, is one who knows when it is best to strive and aspire, and when it is best to practice resignation and simply accept things as they are.

Why call this view 'stoic pragmatism'? Because its allegiance to the Romantic strain in pragmatism is qualified and balanced by a keen appreciation of stoicism's sober insights. Pragmatists tend to regard the natural and social worlds as plastic and malleable, and they seek to remake what they find in the image of their ideals. What sustains pragmatists in this bold endeavour? Hope and faith: hope that the conditions under which human beings currently live can be dramatically improved, and faith that said improvements can be brought about through intelligent action. Stoicism reminds us, however, that our powers to refashion reality are quite limited, that the world is indifferent to us, that most things simply do not matter, and that (pace Protagoras) man is not the measure of all things. So "stoicism and pragmatism enrich and complete one another" (p. 51): whereas pragmatism preaches an empowering gospel of creativity and potentially endless improvement, stoicism preaches a gospel of finitude, limits, and acquiescence. A healthy dose of stoicism keeps pragmatists from becoming pint-sized Fausts, and a steady diet of pragmatism keeps stoics from becoming embittered quietists.

Although this is the central message, it by no means exhausts the content of Lachs's rich and stimulating book. As I see it, the rest of his book is composed of five distinct thematic strands, and a description of each should give potential readers a fairly good idea of what Stoic Pragmatism is all about.

The first, eye-catchingly colourful strand is autobiographical. Lachs tells us about his childhood in Hungary ("I was taught that the recipe for goulash was handed to Hungarians directly by God" (pp. 139-140)), his family's decision to immigrate to Canada after World World II, his undergraduate years at McGill, and his graduate education at Yale, where his dissertation supervisors were Wilfrid Sellars -- "all critical bite" (p. 184) -- and Brand Blanshard -- "all encouragement and appreciation" (p. 184).[1] We also learn about his devotion to Vanderbilt (where he has worked for more than thirty years), his commitment to teaching, his discovery that he was a stoic pragmatist, and the gradual growth of his interest in American pragmatism.[2]

The second strand outlines a social and political philosophy consonant with the tenets of stoic pragmatism. At the centre of this scheme is the individual woman or man, whose liberty Lachs defends with a clutch of anti-paternalist arguments. We must learn to leave other people alone, he says, not because we are selfish or indifferent to them, but precisely because we wish them well; we want them to thrive, to lead fulfilling lives through strenuous and self-directed efforts -- efforts which require the full exercise of one's powers.[3] We are also told that since very few things matter, very little should be prohibited; that our obligations to improve the lot of others are not infinite; that paternalist measures can create permanent dependency; and that we are rarely in a position to know what others ought to do with their lives. For these reasons, Lachs concludes, we should leave people free to seek their own good in their own way, even if what they choose to do strikes us as odd or impious, as foolish or offensive. But leaving other people alone, he hastens to add, does not come easily to most of us; we are neither inclined nor accustomed to give others enough space to create good lives for themselves. The truth is that we love to control people, to wield power over them, to interfere and meddle with their affairs. However, this imperious desire to dominate -- Lachs calls it 'a burning urge' (p. 117) -- must be resisted in the name of human flourishing.

The book's third strand is historical and scholarly. Lachs finds himself powerfully drawn to three figures from the golden age of American philosophy -- William James, Josiah Royce, and George Santayana -- and he has substantial and illuminating things to say about all three. He is especially fond of Santayana -- "my first love in philosophy" (p. 2; cf. p. 183) -- and happily confesses his indebtedness to Scepticism and Animal Faith (1923). Of the many things which Lachs admires in his hero's mature system, two should be singled out: Santayana's brand of naturalism, which fits in quite nicely with stoic pragmatism's view of the cosmos and our place in it; and Santayana's insistence that a philosophy is fundamentally dishonest - a hollow sham or idle pretence - unless it acknowledges the unreasoned and irresistible dictates of animal faith. And any philosopher who takes animal faith seriously, Lachs intimates, will gravitate towards realism, since "the most compelling article of animal faith is that there are independently existing objects in space and time" (p. 175).

The fourth strand is meta-philosophical. As Lachs sees it, philosophy has no special method and no distinctive subject-matter; its task is neither to discover fresh domains of fact nor to speculate about questions which are of little or no practical significance. To be subtle for subtlety's sake alone is a dereliction of intellectual duty, a base betrayal of the philosopher's true vocation. And what is that vocation? To articulate a rich and coherent Weltbild, a many-sided vision of life that will help all of us -- philosophers and non-philosophers alike -- lead better, more satisfying lives. Of course, any vision of life worth taking seriously must be grounded in what we actually know about the world and about ourselves; and this means that no philosophy can be reckoned adequate unless it acknowledges that animal faith commits us to a certain shared conceptual scheme, and that our scheme's structure and content are susceptible of philosophical analysis. But analysis without synthesis is sterile, and reason is less important in philosophy than imagination and sensibility. Philosophers must speak to our condition, and the worth of a philosopher's work is negligible unless it can change the aspect under which we see our lives. The greatest American philosophers -- Emerson, Thoreau, James, Royce, Santayana, and Dewey -- never forgot that philosophy must be relevant to the lives of individuals, and this is one reason why reading their works is still rewarding.

The book's fifth strand, intertwined with its fourth, consists of Lachs's critical reflections on the current state of academic philosophy in the United States. Here his remarks are almost certain to vex and nettle many members of the professoriate. Why? Because Lachs does nothing to disguise his disappointment with what he thinks has happened to American philosophy in the last century. Too many present-day American philosophers, he complains, are afflicted with "physics envy" (p. 61; cf. p. 13).  Impressed by science's magnificent achievements, they assume that philosophy ought to follow its lead, and they think of themselves primarily as professional researchers engaged in purely theoretical pursuits. Encouraged to define themselves as specialists, many professors write exclusively for a tiny sub-set of the scholarly community, and their highly technical work offers little sustenance to a non-academic audience hungry for insight into the human condition. Not coincidentally, their hearts and minds are not transformed by their thoughts; for them, philosophy is essentially an agreeable way of earning a living, not a way of life which makes special moral demands on souls who feel called to follow it. The result of all this, Lachs thinks, is that philosophy is no longer taken very seriously by non-philosophers, and that more than a few philosophy professors lead lives of quiet desperation, no longer sure what their subject is good for. For where, they ask themselves, are the grand discoveries dreamt of by science-besotted philosophers? And what contribution, they wonder, has what now passes as philosophy really made to the betterment of man's estate?[4]

While I think there is some truth in what Lachs says about the current state of academic philosophy -- yes, Virginia, there are some philosophers who are positively green with science-envy, who live by philosophy but not for it (the phrase is Schopenhauer's), who are proud of the fact that their interests are narrow and their papers jargon-laden, who loathe teaching Philosophy 101, and who have nothing to say, qua philosophers, to non-academics -- his treatment of its defects strikes me as exaggerated and one-sided. For one thing, more than a few contemporary American philosophers -- and Lachs himself is one of them[5] -- have written highly accessible, jargon-free works which stress philosophy's relevance to life as it is lived outside the seminar room and the lecture hall. It would be easy to list names here; but since the margin of this review is too narrow to contain them all, I think it best to leave their enumeration as an exercise for the idle reader.

In addition, the Internet has created new and fruitful opportunities for philosophers to speak to the many non-philosophers who have ears to hear. Examples of this sort of high-tech outreach include the superb "Ask Philosophers" website, "The Stone" at the New York Times, the radio program "Philosophy Talk", hosted by John Perry and Ken Taylor, not to mention the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy and the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy. Thanks to the skillful labour of the many professionals and specialists who have contributed content to these and other projects, anyone with an Internet connection now has access to a great deal of philosophical material, much of which is excellent.

Finally, we must not be too quick to assume that highly technical and detailed work in philosophy -- work which leaves outsiders cold, because they find it too hard or dull -- is ipso facto self-indulgent and sterile. Even a cursory survey of the history of Western philosophy shows that a passionate vision and a taste for precision are not necessarily at odds, and that a philosopher may be profound without ceasing to be a dialectician of genius. Hilary Putnam drew our attention to this fact decades ago, and his words deserve to be better-known:

The sad fact is that good philosophy is and always has been hard, and that it is easier to learn the names of a few philosophers than it is to read their books. Those who find philosophy overly 'technical' today would no more have found the time or the inclination to follow Socrates' long chains of argument, or to read one of the Critiques, in an earlier day.[6]

I am sure Lachs knows all this better than I do, however. His real complaint, I suspect, is not that technical sophistication is objectionable per se, but that the radical divorce of theory from practice in the lives of many academic philosophers prevents them from being philosophers in the old-fashioned sense of the term. This point was made memorably by Thoreau, the gadfly of Concord, whose sharp words in Walden still have the power to prick and sting the sensitive professorial conscience:

There are nowadays professors of philosophy, but not philosophers. Yet it is admirable to profess because it was once admirable to live. To be a philosopher is not merely to have subtle thoughts, nor even to found a school, but so to love wisdom as to live according to its dictates a life of simplicity, independence, magnanimity, and trust. It is to solve some of the problems of life, not only theoretically, but practically.[7]

Here it will be asked: Can't we be both professors of philosophy and philosophers in the time-honoured sense of the word? Lachs thinks that we can, but he reminds us that professing philosophy is not the same as practicing it, that 'subtle thoughts' are no substitute for 'wisdom', and that an author who aspires 'to found a school' is less worthy of emulation than a person who is determined 'to solve some of the problems of life, not only theoretically, but practically.' For my part, I think Lachs is more right than wrong about most of this; and I am confident thatStoic Pragmatism, like Walden, will elevate and humble readers by reminding them of their half-forgotten hopes for a nobler life.


[1] According to Lachs, "we need to continue expanding the canon [i.e., of American philosophy] by adding to it thinkers whose work is excellent but who have, for one reason or another, been neglected over the years" (pp. 192-192; cf. p. 186; emphasis mine). This description fits Lachs's old advisor Brand Blanshard (1892-1987) to a T; and anyone who wonders about its aptness should read Blanshard's first book, The Nature of Thought (London: Allen and Unwin, 1939) -- quite possibly the most lucid and methodical defence of a coherence theory of truth ever offered -- or one of the books from his 'Reason' trilogy: Reason and Analysis (LaSalle: Open Court, 1964), Reason and Goodness (London: Allen and Unwin, 1966), and Reason and Belief (London: Allen and Unwin, 1974).

[2] It was not certainly love at first sight: "I read Dewey in those days and found him terminally boring" (p. 184).

[3] As Lachs points out, this line of argument commits us to helping people who are unable to help themselves: "Leaving others alone because we want them to do well has as its flip side helping them when the need arises. If we wish everyone well, we must be ready to aid them in emergencies or when obstacles are overwhelming" (p. 121).

[4] Lachs's charge that too many contemporary philosophers in the United States suffer from 'science-envy' or 'physics envy' echoes one of the central themes of Anthony T. Kronman'sEducation's End: Why our Colleges and Universities Have Given Up on the Meaning of Life (New Haven and London: Yale University Press, 2007). According to Kronman, the self-understanding of humanities departments in American universities changed radically in the decades immediately following the Civil War, when the research model was imported from Germany. By the end of the nineteenth century, most professors of philosophy, literature, history and classics saw themselves not as guides to the wisdom of the past (their role in the antebellum period), but as specialists committed to advancing knowledge incrementally within a particular branch of inquiry. My point is not that Kronman's historical account is correct (though it may well be), only that many of Lachs's complaints about the current state of philosophy in America are congruent with its gist.

[5] See, for instance, his Intermediate Man (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1981), or The Relevance of Philosophy to Life (Nashville: Vanderbilt University Press, 1995), or In Love with Life: Reflections on the Joy of Living and Why We Hate to Die (Nashville: Vanderbilt University Press, 2008).

[6] Mind, Language and Reality. Philosophical Papers, Volume 2. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1975), pp. 132-133.

[7] Walden, or Life in the Woods (New York: Harper and Row, 1965), p. 11. Several years prior to the publication of Walden, Thoreau expressed similar sentiments in his essay "Thomas Carlyle and His Works" (1847): "To live like a philosopher, is to live, not foolishly, like other men, but wisely, and according to universal laws. In this, which was the ancient sense, we think there has been no philosopher in modern times" (Collected Essays and Poems. New York: Library of America, 2001), pp. 193-194.